Gorgias, Menexenus, Protagoras

Placeholder book cover

Plato, Gorgias, Menexenus, Protagoras, Malcolm Schofield (ed.), Tom Griffith (tr.), Cambridge UP, 2010, xliv+214pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521546003.

Reviewed by C.C.W. Taylor, Corpus Christi College, Oxford



The appearance of this volume in the series Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought naturally raises the question why the dialogues which it contains should be counted as contributions to specifically political, as opposed to more generally moral, thought. The central questions of both the Gorgias and the Protagoras lie at the heart of Platonic ethics; what is the best life for a human being, the nature of virtue and its relation to knowledge, the unity of virtue, pleasure and the good, whether it is worse to act unjustly than to suffer injustice, whether, and in what sense, everyone aims at what is best in whatever he/she does. These are among the topics that one naturally cites in describing the subject matter of these dialogues, and prima facie none of these are questions in political theory.

This is not, however, to say that the dialogues have no political dimensions. The question from which the Gorgias begins is ‘What is rhetoric?’, which leads into the question of the proper role of rhetoric in the life of the polis. Gorgias and his disciples assume that rhetoric is par excellence the means to achieve political power; hence the role of rhetoric is nothing less than that of enabling its practitioners to govern. Socrates’ claim that everyone wants only what is good for him/herself leads to a revisionary conception of power; to be powerful is to be able to achieve what you want, hence only those who are able to achieve what is genuinely good for themselves possess real power. Since rhetoric as ordinarily practiced rests on no understanding of what is good, it is redescribed as a practice similar to cookery or cosmetics, whose aim is to please and flatter those whom it influences, not to promote their good. Similarly the Protagoras starts with the question ‘What is a sophist?’, which correspondingly leads into a discussion of the educational role of the sophist in the life of the polis, in the course of which Protagoras sets out a convincing justification for the fundamental principle of democracy, that participation in the political process should be open to all, not confined to an elite identified by the possession of some specific technical expertise.

These specifically political topics might be said to be incidental to the central, i.e. specifically moral, questions listed above; but it is more illuminating to say that both dialogues illustrate the seamless interweaving of the moral and the political in Plato’s thought, and, more generally, in much of Greek thought. The central topic of both dialogues is the nature of goodness and how it is to be achieved, and fundamental to that discussion is the assumption that that achievement must take place in the context of the polis, with consequent implications for the proper conduct of institutions and practices such as sophistry and rhetoric which shape the ways in which the members of the polis pursue their goals.

The Gorgias and the Protagoras can then count legitimately, though indirectly, as texts in the history of political thought. I am not sure that the same can be said of the Menexenus, which is a parody of one kind of political speech, viz. a funerary eulogy of those killed in war (of which the most celebrated example is Pericles’ Funeral Speech in Thucydides Book II). One might perhaps seek to draw from the text some general theses of a political nature, though I am not sure what they might be, and the editor of this volume does not attempt this. I think the best one can say is that the Gorgias is, in part, a dialogue about political oratory, and the Menexenus is Plato’s only example of writing in that specific genre (as distinct from examples of other kinds of oratory in e.g. the Phaedrus and Symposium), an example, moreover, which, as the editor observes, ‘bears out the diagnosis of sycophancy pronounced in the Gorgias’ (p. xix).

The dialogues are translated by Tom Griffith and the editorial matter is provided by Malcolm Schofield, though the prefatory note (p. vi) indicates that each reviewed the work of the other. Schofield provides a general introduction, a list of principal dates running from the accession of Cyrus in 550 to the King’s Peace of 387/6 and a guide for further reading, including general reading and sections on each of the three dialogues. Each dialogue is furnished with a list of dramatis personae, an analysis of the structure and footnotes (and the Protagoras concludes with an appendix containing a reconstruction of the poem of Simonides). There is a general index.

As one would expect from a scholar of Schofield’s stature, the standard of all of this work is extremely high. The introduction deals succinctly with central topics, including resemblances and contrasts between the Gorgias and the Protagoras (ending with the intriguing suggestion that ‘the Gorgias is the work of an angry young man, the Protagoras the product of more detached middle age’ (p. viii)), the sophists, and specific topics in the Gorgias (the nature of power and the argument with Callicles) and the Protagoras (the critique of the sophists and Socrates’ intellectualist argument). A particularly interesting section (pp. xxiii-xxv) discusses connections between the Protagoras and the Symposium, including the overlap of characters and other structural details, and concludes with the suggestion (controversial, but by no means implausible) that the Protagoras was the later dialogue, in which Plato intends to remind the reader of the Symposium. In view of the treatment of the dialogues as contributions to political thought, one topic which one might have expected to be discussed but which is not, is the relation between nomos and phusis, which figures significantly in both the Gorgias and the Protagoras. While Callicles insists on the radical opposition between the two, Protagoras’ myth argues on the contrary that nomos is a product of phusis, in that law and morality develop naturally to ensure the preservation of society, and thereby of the human species, in a hostile world.

The footnotes do not amount to a commentary (they are not intended to), but provide the reader, in addition to essential information on literary and historical matters, with useful pointers to stages in the argument. The guide to reading is thorough and helpful. In all this wealth of material I found only one tiny nit to pick: in discussing Protagoras’ literary criticism (p. ix) Schofield says that he complained of Homer’s treating the word ‘wrath’ in the first line of the Iliad as feminine in gender, and quotes the word for ‘wrath’ as mētis (which actually means ‘wisdom’) instead of mēnis. If that is an editorial slip, rather than a misprint, it is the only one I have detected.

On the whole, the translation reads fluently. I have no complaints as to its accuracy, but in its quest for colloquial liveliness it occasionally tips over into a slangy idiom which misrepresents the register of Plato’s writing. The vocatives ōgathe and ō anthrōpe are sometimes rendered ‘mister’ (pp. 89, 103, 167), a form of address which belongs to the dialect of cheeky urchins and dubious foreigners in comic literature (" ‘Allo mister, you like feelthy postcard?"). At 507a Callicles actually encourages Socrates to continue the conversation with the words ’Say on, mister’ (rendering ‘Leg’, ōgathe’), which is surely not a possible sentence for any native English speaker at any period in the history of the language. When Protagoras says (317c) that he is old enough to be the father of any one of those present, the translator has him say ‘I could be father to any of you lot’ (p. 153), where ‘you lot’ makes him sound like a bullying sergeant-major or a bored schoolmaster. The most jarring example is the repeated rendering (pp. 61, 91,113) of epi korrēs tuptein as ‘give him a knuckle sandwich’. Callicles does indeed describe his use of this expression as ‘somewhat coarse’ (agroikoteron (486c), but ‘give him a knuckle sandwich’ goes too far in vulgarisation. More than that, one passage where the expression occurs (Dem. 21.72) actually indicates a contrast between hitting someone ‘with the knuckles’ (kondulois, i.e. with the clenched fist) and epi korrēs tuptein, which seems to be slapping someone’s face. So ‘knuckle sandwich’, i.e. a punch in the mouth, seems actually to be the wrong rendering. ‘Give him a smack in the face’ is both semantically more precise and closer to the roughness of idiom which Callicles acknowledges.

I am not sure what kind of reader is likely to benefit most from this volume. Students of Platonic ethics, including those studying in translation only, are, as Schofield’s guide for further reading shows, already amply served with commentaries and translations of the Gorgias and the Protagoras, and I see no reason to suppose that this volume will supplant the existing resources. Less work, it is true, has been done on the Menexenus, but it is available in English in John Cooper’s complete Hackett translation, and in any case few are likely to purchase this volume for the sake of the Menexenus alone. I suppose that its appearance in this series may encourage students of ancient political theory to supplement their study of the major Platonic political texts by consideration of these dialogues, which they might otherwise have neglected. If so, it will have served a useful purpose.