Gottlob Frege: Basic Laws of Arithmetic

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Gottlob Frege, Gottlob Frege: Basic Laws of Arithmetic, Philip A. Ebert and Marcus Rossberg (eds., trs.), Oxford University Press, 2013, 680pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199281749.

Reviewed by Erich H. Reck, University of California at Riverside


Several works by Gottlob Frege have played the role of canonical texts within English-speaking philosophy for decades, especially "On Sense and Reference", available in English since 1948, The Foundations of Arithmetic, since 1950, and Begriffsschrift, since 1967.[1] (In German: "Über Sinn und Bedeutung", originally published in 1891, Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik, 1884, and Begriffsschrift, 1879). However, the work generally seen as Frege's magnum opus and meant to be his crowning achievement -- Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (Vols. 1-2) -- has been available in translation only in the form of excerpts so far, mostly in The Basic Laws of Arithmetic (M. Furth, ed., tr., 1964) and in The Frege Reader (M. Beaney, ed., tr., 1997).[2] Now Philip A. Ebert and Marcus Rossberg finally provide us with a complete English translation of Grundgesetze (both volumes together). This is cause for celebration, for English-speaking philosophers generally and for the community of Frege scholars more particularly, especially since the new translation is of high quality and the accompanying editorial material very helpful.

In his first book, Begriffsschrift, Frege had introduced his revolutionary new logic, an idiosyncratic version of higher-order relational and quantificational logic, together with applications to some important inferences in arithmetic. In his second, Grundlagen/Foundations, he went on to criticize various philosophical views about the theory of the natural numbers, including Kant's and Mill's, and, against that background, sketched his own proposal for how to reduce it to logic. During the following years, Frege realized that further refinements of his logical framework and his corresponding account of language were needed, e.g., his famous sense-reference distinction and a general theory of classes. Grundgesetzte/Basic Laws (Vol. I: 1893, Vol. II: 1903) was meant to synthesize all these contributions and present them systematically. That is to say, it was meant to provide an updated, well-motivated introduction to Frege's logic, as well as detailed, technical treatments of the theories of the natural and real numbers, again along logicist lines. (A projected Vol. 3, which never materialized, was supposed to complete the treatment of the real numbers and, most likely, extend the approach to the complex numbers.) After Basic Laws (his last book), Frege only published a few shorter pieces during his lifetime.

Basic Laws (BL) is clearly central to the history of modern logic, the history of the philosophy of mathematics, and the history of analytic philosophy. It remains of considerable interest today. This is so despite the fact that Frege's approach was soon -- after the discovery of Russell's antinomy -- overshadowed by Whitehead and Russell's Principia Mathematica (1910-13) and then by twentieth-century set-theory, proof theory, and model theory (Zermelo-Fraenkel, Hilbert, Tarski, etc.). For one thing, Frege influenced thinkers such as Russell, Wittgenstein, Husserl, Hilbert, and Carnap directly with BL in ways still studied today. For another, during the last 2-3 decades it has been rediscovered in the philosophy of mathematics, as tied to the rise of neo-logicism (by Crispin Wright, Bob Hale, etc.) and reactions to it (by George Boolos, Richard Heck, John Burgess, Kit Fine, William Demopoulos, and many others). As BL is a long and complex work, in various respects, fully translating, re-editing, and careful typesetting it was a massive endeavor, which took ten years. A large group of experts was involved, directly or indirectly, so that its publication has also been widely anticipated.

Before further discussing and evaluating various aspects of the new English translation, together with the editorial material attached to it, let me provide a brief overview of the contents of BL's two volumes so as to be able to point out what has and what has not been available in English up to now.

Volume 1 of BL starts with a substantive Foreword in which Frege motivates his approach philosophically by providing brief but pointed criticisms of various formalist and psychologistic views about logic and arithmetic prominent at his time. It is against such views, as well as against Kantian idealism and Millian empiricism, that his own proposal is directed primarily. In a short Introduction, he then distinguishes his approach from the two technical approaches closest to it:, Schröder's and Dedekind's. The rest of Volume 1 is divided into two parts. In Part I, Frege presents his logical language, together with a list of inference rules, logical laws, and central definitions, such as those of cardinal number, the number 0, the number 1, and the relation of following in a series. On that basis, Frege starts to derive various arithmetic truths as reconstructed within his logical framework. In Part II, he continues this procedure, providing more formally precise and "gapless" derivation of central laws and theorems of arithmetic. In addition, Frege presents explicit, more general reconstructions of mathematical induction, recursion, countably infinite classes, and the cardinal number he calls "Endlos". Volume 1 ends with three short Appendices, in which his basic laws together with the propositions immediately following from them, his central definitions, and his main theorems are listed.

Volume 2 picks up where Volume 1 left off, providing proofs of additional arithmetic theorems within Frege's system. (Presumably this part could not be included in Volume 1 because of page restrictions.) In Part III, Frege moves on to the real numbers. This part begins with a lengthy and informal polemic against views about these numbers prominent in the literature, parallel to what Frege had done for the natural numbers in Foundations. The criticisms concern again formalist and psychologistic views but also, more generally, approaches invoking the step-by-step "creation" of new number systems. Among Frege's explicit targets are: Georg Cantor, Richard Dedekind, Eduard Heine, Otto Stolz, Johannes Thomae, and Karl Weierstrass. This polemic leads to a more positive discussion of the notion of magnitude, including a new approach to magnitudes meant to form the core of Frege's treatment of the real numbers, once more on a purely logical foundation. But not all of the details are filled in; the approach is only sketched. At the end, Frege includes two further Appendices, again with tables of definitions and theorems. Famously, or infamously, Volume 2 also contains an Afterword (added when the rest of the book was already in press) in which Frege provides his initial response to Russell's recently discovered antinomy, which he acknowledges to be both threatening to his project and important in itself.

Which parts in this complete translation have not been available in English before? Furth's earlier edition includes only certain parts of Volume 1: the Foreword (called "Introduction" there), the Introduction (relabeled as "§0"), and Part I up to §52. This amounts to less than a third of Volume 1. Furth adds two Appendices: Frege's Afterword to Volume 2, on Russell's antinomy; and excerpts from Volumes 1 and 2 (§§54-55, 91), needed to make sense of the notation and basic ideas in it. Beaney's more recent Frege Reader, on the other hand, includes similar but less material from Volume 1, in revised translations: Frege's Foreword, Introduction, and §§1-7, 26-29, and 32-33 of Part I, again together with the Afterword from Volume 2, on Russell's antinomy. In addition, it contains translations of further passages from Volume 2, Part III, i.e., selections from Frege's polemics against rival views about the real numbers (§§55-67, 138-147). The latter amounts to about one seventh of Volume 2, so only a small part of it. What had, thus, been missing in English are: all of Part II (spanning Volumes 1-2); a large part of Part III (contained in Volume 2); and Frege's own Appendices (from Volumes 1 and 2, respectively).

Furth's and Beaney's selections reflect an emphasis on Frege's logic and on his views about language (as lengthy, helpful editorial introductions by each of them make clear further). These selections are understandable and were reasonable at the time. The philosophy of language, in particular, played a central role in Anglo-American philosophy in the second half of the twentieth century. Consequently, Frege was treated mostly as a philosopher of language and of logic during that period (under Michael Dummett's influence, among others), while his views in the philosophy of mathematics were more marginal. The Frege Reader was meant, and has served well, as a resource for teaching him to a broad audience. An additional reason for the choices Furth and Beaney made becomes evident when one looks at the sections of BL omitted by them, especially those in Part II. They are full of derivations in Frege's idiosyncratic two-dimensional symbolism, a fact that made them very hard to typeset. Actually, it is not just his basic notation that played a role here but also the many further symbols Frege insisted on introducing so as to be rigorous (more on them below).

Today logic and the philosophy of language are less central in our discipline than they were before. Discussions of Frege have, correspondingly, shifted towards seeing him more as a philosopher of mathematics again, not, or not just, as a philosopher of language and of logic. The new translation of BL conforms to that shift. Let me now turn to some of its most important and noteworthy aspects.

One of the main difficulties in translating, not just in philosophy, is to settle on a consistent terminology, adequate across shifting contexts. This difficulty is compounded if writings by an author have been translated before, perhaps by several translators, and especially if the terminology used is not uniform. All of this is the case for Frege, as comparison of earlier translations of his works reveals. And of course, many philosophical words and phrases simply are very hard to translate. In Frege's case, the latter include: "Bedeutung", "Begriffsschrift", and "Vorstellung", as has been pointed out repeatedly; but also "Aussage", "Bestimmung", "Erkenntnis", "Erklärung", "Satz", "Wortsprache", and "Zeichen", among others. Ebert and Rossberg are well aware of these difficulties and, to their credit, address them head on in their Translators' Introduction. They provide an explicit list of Fregean terms that caused them problems, including those just mentioned, together with their reasons for their translations. They also offer a more inclusive Glossary of technical terms, in English and German. Finally, they add a number of editorial footnotes in which related subtleties are addressed further. All of this makes it easy to check, and reconsider, the translations adopted. Clearly the translators proceeded very self-consciously, thoughtfully, and, most of all, transparently.

Without having checked all the details, I would say that Ebert and Rossberg have produced a translation that is reliable and extremely useful for scholars. Inevitably, some of their decisions will be controversial, or at least subject to debate, e.g., their rendering of "Bedeutung" as "reference" (not "denotation", "meaning", or leaving it un-translated) and their choice of "proposition" for "Satz". (I strongly agree with the former, but still wonder about the latter.) It is worth noting that they adopted a procedure meant to be "exegetically neutral", which they describe as follows:

Technical terms are translated uniformly and not translated away. Passages that are ambiguous or otherwise unclear are often purposefully translated so as to retain the unclarities. We did not attempt to 'improve' on the original; our goal was to translate the text so that it is suitable for scholarly work (p. xxix).

This was a very beneficial procedural choice, I believe (which is not to say that less "neutral" translations, such as J.L. Austin's version of The Foundations of Arithmetic, may not have other virtues, e.g. elegance). Also noteworthy is the careful attention paid to various cognates in Frege's texts (e.g., "Zeichen", "Bezeichnung", "bezeichnen", etc.), to common word stems ("bedeuten", "andeuten", etc.), and to the original linguistic context (conventions for word usage in German during Frege's time). Both translators are native German speakers, besides being fluent in English, which clearly made them especially sensitive to such aspects.

Three further choices by Ebert and Rossberg were both crucial and very beneficial. Most importantly, they decided to use Frege's original logical notation, i.e., his two-dimensional combination of vertical strokes, horizontal strokes, concavities, Roman and Gothic letters, etc., rather than translating everything into the common one-dimensional notation of modern logic (derived from Peano, Russell, and Hilbert).[3] This decision was made possible, or at least more feasible, by the development of a LaTeX program for typesetting Frege's idiosyncratic notation.[4] Using LaTeX also makes the way in which BL is typeset look sharp more generally; indeed, it makes it look terrific. Another good choice was to adhere strictly to the original pagination, which makes comparing the translations of particular passages with the original German much easier. Third, the numbering of Frege's own footnotes was left intact, while editorial comments have been relegated to endnotes. Beyond these three choices, several pieces of editorial material are included that add further value to the book. This includes the already mentioned Translators' Introduction, which covers crucial aspects concerning the translation, typesetting, etc. There is also a new index (for both volumes together) and a complete bibliography of all the texts cited by Frege, often including later translations. (Neither an index nor a complete bibliography were present in the German original.) Finally, the book contains a short Foreword by Wright, who initiated the whole project and guided it throughout, and an Appendix by Roy Cook, another core member of the editorial team.

Cook's lengthy and helpful Appendix is worth additional comment. In it, he introduces Frege's logical system -- its inference rules, basic laws, and the idiosyncratic notations for each of them -- in a reader-friendly way. As Cook explains, this is not meant to facilitate translating the text, simply and quickly, back into more usual logical symbolism (although it does that to some degree) but rather to help the serious reader start to get "fluent" in Frege's notational system. As recognized increasingly in the secondary literature, and as highlighted in the Appendix, Frege's logical notation has its own, distinctive advantages (e.g., by making more easily visible what the antecedents of a complex conditional are). Moreover, it is often not translatable into later symbolism without loss since it contains technically and philosophically relevant peculiarities (e.g., Frege's "judgment stroke" and his two different ways of expressing generality). Finally, Cook goes over a large number of the unusual symbols used throughout BL in Frege's definitions of central mathematical terms, an editorial contribution that has less precedent in the literature and is especially helpful.[5] The corresponding list concerns, among others, the definitions of cardinal number, application (thus element-hood), single-valued-ness, the ancestral (weak and strong), and the ordered pair.

So far, I have highlighted various strengths of the new translation and accompanying editorial apparatus. I have a few criticisms too, mostly concerning some notable omissions in the editorial material. After voicing these criticisms, I will return to further benefits of finally having a complete edition of BL available.

A first omission that struck me is that, despite having a generally helpful Translators' Introduction, as well as a lengthy editorial Appendix, there is little discussion in either of them about controversies -- interpretive, philosophical or otherwise -- involving issues central to BL. What I have in mind are not so much the classic, wellworn debates about Frege, e.g., concerning his sense-reference distinction or the introduction of classes via Basic Law V. Yet wouldn't it have been worth adding a few pointers to, say, disagreements in the more recent literature about how to read Frege's logical notations (in works by Heck, Gregory Landini, and Danielle Macbeth, among others)? This would seem to be particularly relevant for a text containing so much of that notation. Now, I can easily imagine two reasons for this omission: first, to avoid adding further pages, via editorial material, to an already overly long book; second, to avoid making this new edition of BL dated by tying it too closely to some current controversies, or more simply, to avoid overloading it with concerns from the secondary literature. Such responses would be fair enough, especially the length consideration (probably also enforced by the publisher via page restrictions).

There is a second omission which may be explained similarly but which I find again unfortunate. The editors provide no discussion, or even references, to relevant literature, of the question how the logical system in BL compares to those in other Fregean texts. One obvious reference point here is Begriffsschrift, published fourteen years before Volume 1 of BL. This text does play some role in the editorial material, but only a minor one. Besides several short pieces from Frege's Nachlass, a second important but much less widely known reference point could have been the following: Frege's lectures on logic from 1910-14, several years after Volume 2 of BL, as recorded by Rudolf Carnap and made available in English a decade ago (as Frege's Lectures on Logic: Carnap's Jena Notes, 1910-1914, E. Reck and S. Awodey, eds., Open Court, 2004). This text is not even mentioned by the editors. What would have warranted at least some comments here is this: There were changes in Frege's logic not just from Begriffsschrift to BL, as often noted before, but also after BL. The latter are changes about which earlier editors of BL who focused on his logic (e.g., Furth), did not know yet and, therefore, could not have commented. Ebert and Rossberg missed a chance in this respect; they could easily have stimulated further research on this topic.

While length considerations and related concerns may well explain such omissions, I suspect that there is a further factor. The main people in charge of the present translation -- Ebert, Rossberg, Cook, and their mentor Wright -- are all members of the Scottish school of neo-logicism. Within that school, the focus has been on certain Fregean themes, while others are more marginal or have been largely ignored. For example, the relationship between BL and Foundations has received a lot of attention (the different ways in which, say, Hume's Principle plays a role in these two texts); but this is much less the case for the relationship between BL and other Fregean texts, such as Begriffsschrift and his 1910-14 lectures. Similarly, issues pertaining to Frege's distinctive approach to logic, including subtle differences between earlier and later approaches, have not found much attention in neo-logicism (e.g., questions about the historical sources of some of Frege's main ideas or questions about his attitude towards meta-theoretic arguments). It appears, then, that a neo-logicist orientation has shaped this new edition of BL significantly. Had members of a different school produced it, other aspects would have been highlighted. Then again, this is always the case; and everyone owes the Scottish neo-logicists a debt for taking on this huge project and for carrying it all the way through.

One could quibble with a few further details in the editorial material. For instance, in the Translators' Introduction, while justifying their translation of the word 'Bedeutung', Ebert and Rossberg write: "Frege takes the Bedeutung of a term to be the object referred to/denoted by that term" (p. xvii). But what about function terms; does the notion of reference not apply to them as well? This particular remark seems somewhat careless and misleading. As one example from Cook's Appendix, I found his discussion of how the "horizontals" in complex Fregean formulas work more confusing than helpful (how they "fuse" etc., cf. pp. A 10-11). Then again, these are very minor weaknesses, there are few of them, and they all concern the editorial apparatus. More crucially, this new translation (the text itself) is quite reliable; and when there is potential for controversies, the translators have been admirably transparent about it, as already mentioned. One additional strength of the new edition is worth making explicit as well. Namely, the technical details in Frege's presentation, together with its new typesetting, have been double-checked in a very careful, thorough manner, as is clear. In fact, another added benefit is an updated, annotated list of errata, which replaces earlier such lists.[6] Finally, simply having all of BL available in English will surely provide Frege scholarship with another boost.

Let me round off this review with a few observations, or speculations, about specific directions in which Frege scholarship might be led by this new edition of BL. This will build on my discussion above of some of the differences to earlier editions. It will also help to highlight further the significance of this publication.

In the Anglo-American literature, there have been intense debates about logical, philosophical, and mathematical themes in Frege's writings for decades, including: his introduction of modern relational and quantificational logic, the sense-reference distinction, the "Frege-Russell conception of number", Frege's theory of classes or value-ranges, and its demise because of Russell's antinomy. As my remarks about Furth's and Beaney's partial English editions of BL reveal, these are identical with, or closely related to, themes on which those earlier editions focused -- and not coincidentally so, I would think. A more recent wave of discussions about Frege, concerned primarily with the continuing relevance of his philosophy of mathematics, has made "Frege's Theorem" central, i.e., the fact that a version of the Dedekind-Peano axioms follows from Hume's Principle in second-order logic, as Frege showed. Initially the main text in that context was Frege's Foundations; but BL, and corresponding changes in it, have been investigated more and more as well. (This was, presumably, a main motivation for neo-logicists like Wright to support its full translation into English.)

Even more recently, inquiries into parts of BL that were left out, or at least severely underrepresented, in earlier, partial English editions have begun. Recall here that Part II (spanning Volumes 1-2) had been omitted completely before. Consequently, only scholars willing and able to work with the original German were in a position to reexamine Frege's treatments of, say, mathematical induction, recursion, and countably infinite classes. This is bound to change, or it has already begun to change. (A pioneer in this respect is Heck, building on earlier work by Boolos and others.) Further details in Frege's BL -- buried in the forbidding-looking technical parts that were only partially available, thus underemphasized, until now -- are still to be rediscovered. An added difficulty in this connection consists in Frege's already mentioned, very unusual choice of symbols, e.g., in his definition of cardinal number. I predict that new discussions of some such details will spring up soon (also helped by Cook's Appendix and by the inclusion of Frege's own Appendices). Yet another difference between the new, complete and older, partial translations of BL is, again, that we have Frege's long, pointed polemics from Volume 2, together with his own (sketchy) treatment of the real numbers, only available in full now. This too is bound to have an influence by reviving discussions of themes in those sections.[7]

Let me add one last prediction about future scholarship. While Frege was seen primarily as a logician and philosopher of language for a long time, I mentioned that his philosophy of mathematics has enjoyed a renaissance over the last few decades. In line with that development, another impact the present edition of BL might well have is to cement the shift of emphasis towards Frege's philosophy of mathematics more firmly. It should make abundantly clear that the context for Frege's reflections on language and logic was always his work on the foundations of mathematics. The latter is what his magnum opus is all about, as having it available in its entirety makes plain to see. This is not to say that there shouldn't be further inquiries into Frege's contributions to the philosophy of language and logic. But they can now proceed with fuller awareness of the primary context of these contributions, which might even lead to further insights into old topics, such as the sense-reference distinction.

In any case, the present re-publication and first complete English translation of Basic Laws of Arithmetic is a significant event. As translating philosophical texts is still often underappreciated (even massively so), let me close this review by reiterating how much time and effort went into this one, including collaborative effort. As mentored by Wright, not only the primary translators and editors, Ebert, Rossberg, and Cook, were involved in this project, but a large group of additional advisors as well, consisting of many of today's leading Frege experts. (This group includes: M. Beaney, G. Gabriel, M. Hallett, R. Heck, R. May, W. Pedriali, E. Picardi, W. Stirton, K. Wehmeier, and C. Thiel. Several other Frege scholars were involved in the project more tangentially.) Over ten years, in numerous "Grundgesetze Workshop", held in several countries, these people hammered away at the translation we now have in our hands. I think I can speak for other readers that the result was well worth the wait. This version of BL looks terrific, is helpful in various scholarly respects, and will have a big impact, I am sure. I want to congratulate the translators and editors, especially Ebert and Rossberg, on a major achievement.[8]


I am grateful to Michael Beaney and Michael Kremer for helpful comments, as well as Philip Ebert, Marcus Rossberg, and Roy Cook for corrections of small errors in an earlier draft of this review.

[1] For more on the translation and publication history of Frege's texts, cf. the Translators' Introduction, p. xvi.

[2] The Foreword, Introduction, and §§1-7 of Part I of Grundgesetze were first translated and published, by J. Stachelroth and P. Jourdain, in The Monist, 1915-17. An edited and somewhat shortened version of this material was reproduced in P. Geach and M. Black's Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege (Oxford: Blackwell, 1952), together with new translations of selected parts of Volume 2. Beaney's 1997 volume, based on similar but again shortened selections, replaced both.

[3] This is in contrast to a recent, somewhat peculiar edition of Frege's text in German: Grundgesetze der Arithmetik, Begriffsschriftlich abgeleitet, Band I und II. In moderne Formalnotation transkribiert und mit einem ausführlichen Sachregister versehen, T. Müller, B. Schröder, and R. Stuhlman-Laeisz, eds., mentis Verlag: Münster, 2009.

[4] Ebert and Rossberg thank various contributors in this connection, including: J. Parsons, R. Heck, J.J. Green, A. Rayo, R. MacInnis, and R. Dyckhoff. A very useful by-product of the BL translation project is that this powerful LaTeX program for Begriffsschrift notation is now available more generally.

[5] For more on Frege's unusual, so far largely neglected choice of symbols (often influenced by contingent typesetting matters), see J.J. Green, M. Rossberg and P. Ebert, "The convenience of the typesetter: notation and typography in Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik", Bulletin of Symbolic Logic 21, 2015, pp. 15-30.

[6] In addition, Ebert and Rossberg have created a website where unnoted typos and other problems in their new translation of Grundgesetze are to be listed. The website also provides a platform for downloading relevant LaTeX software, papers written using Frege's original symbolism, and related material.

[7] Ebert and Rossberg are currently also co-editing Essays on Frege's Basic Laws of Arithmetic (Oxford University Press), a companion volume to their new translation of Grundgesetze. In it, various authors (including me) will contribute papers on some of the topics just mentioned. This forthcoming volume is an indication of the work already inspired by the new translation.

[8] It may be worth highlighting that Ebert and Rossberg did most of the translating and editing work for BL before having secure (tenured or similar) positions. They took a big risk in putting so much time and energy into this project. Wright is to be thanked for, among others, helping them secure financial support along the way, initially as part of his Arché Project in St. Andrews. Fortunately, Ebert's and Rossberg's current academic institutions (the University of Stirling, Scotland, and the University of Connecticut, USA, respectively) have also been supportive of their efforts.