Governing Least: A New England Libertarianism

Placeholder book cover

Dan Moller, Governing Least: A New England Libertarianism, Oxford University Press, 2019, 326pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190863241.

Reviewed by Andrew Lister, Queen's University


The premise of Dan Moller's book is that "we should only use reason and persuasion to accomplish our distributive aims" (1). The book's main thesis is that the modern welfare state is unjust because it uses force for the sake of redistribution. Moller argues on the basis of "every day moral beliefs" (1), in particular the belief that it is wrong "to shift burdens onto others by force" (6). If my car breaks down, I can't demand that you share yours with me, let alone force you to do so; "I don't get to shift the burdens of my foster-care upbringing onto you by forcing you to give me $1000 toward college" (143). Moller asks us to consider whether we would be willing to stand up at a meeting with our neighbors and make the following speech: 'Because I have fallen on hard times, I demand that you provide me with financial assistance, and that you help me force others to do likewise' (3). Most of us would balk at making this speech, he thinks, but not at making the analogous appeal in the case of theft and assault.

As this example suggests, Moller applies the norms of inter-personal morality directly to the state. The state does not have "emergent" powers that individuals lack. It is true that once we band together to do something permissible collectively, it may become impermissible to do it individually; individuals can't take justice into their own hands, where there is a "superseding authority." But this authority must respect the moral rules that constrain individuals (21). Thus if it's wrong for me to take your rightful property without your consent, it is wrong for the welfare state to do so (28). Property rights can be overridden; if I face death by exposure, I am justified in ignoring the sign saying 'keep out; private property' on your cabin in the woods. The stakes must be high, however. Public safety and emergency health care justify overriding property rights, but education, pensions and poverty assistance do not. I can commandeer your possessions to rescue people from a house on fire, but not to pay for their education (40). Moreover, even when the goals in question pass this high threshold of moral importance, we incur residual obligations as a result of having infringed the rights of others -- the obligation to fix the lock on your cabin, for example, to replace the food I ate, and to apologize for having broken in.

Moller's argument thus runs as follows (38):

  1. It is wrong to appropriate the rightful property of others without meeting the threshold or, where the threshold is met, without satisfying the residual obligations that result from having infringed a person's rights.
  2. The welfare state frequently appropriates property to which people are entitled without meeting the threshold and, where the threshold is met, without satisfying the residual obligations that result from this infringement.
  3. Therefore "the welfare state does and is wrong."

Critics of libertarianism might admit that it takes powerful reasons to justify overriding people's property rights, but claim that we are free to define property rights so as to promote goals such as social equality. Moller argues that property is "a moral phenomenon" (48), however, that constrains laws and social conventions. The core moral notion of property is that of a differential right of control; if I own something, I get to decide what happens with it, not without limit, but in a way that you do not (50). Moller asserts that people have moral claims to such differential control prior to and independently of the rules of any particular society, based on a variety of factors including discovery, creation, and adding value. For example, if Emily discovers a pretty seashell on a beach covered in seashells, her claim to it is stronger than Mark's, even though she didn't engage in any serious labour in picking it up (53). Other factors weaken claims to property: if one engages in waste, for example, or if one leaves less for others to use and appropriate (54). This broadly Lockean view explains how there can be moral rights and wrongs regarding control of assets in a variety of cases beyond the reach of or contrary to social institutions: when through carelessness I break my roommate's blender; when European colonists take indigenous lands; when after breakdown of law and order men with guns take crops others have grown; and when the law of land says that everything and everyone is the property of our "Dear Leader" (62-4). According to Moller, the purely institutional or conventional view of property cannot accommodate our intuitive moral reactions to these cases. Property rights can be and generally are genuine moral rights, in his view, not merely legal rights.

This defense of moral rights to private property raises the question of whether the state is permitted to do anything, e.g., compel people to pay for police protection. Moller justifies the minimal state's use of force by appeal to an "anti-free rider principle." If a benefit is important, widely needed, and we have no way to provide it to ourselves without making it available to others, then we can require others to contribute, or exit. For those who benefit net of contribution, this duty is simply a matter of not using non-excludability to avoid paying for a good that one would have paid for had it been excludable. But even those who don't benefit net of the required contribution may be required to contribute, so long as it is reasonable to suspect they benefit (76). However, the state may only compel people to contribute to the provision of services "people cannot without grave harm to themselves avoid providing to all" (78). National security, law enforcement, and basic infrastructure pass the test, but universal health care and a guaranteed minimum income do not (78).

Readers who are not already libertarian may wonder why we can't force people to help those in need. In order to be consistent with his method of appealing to uncontroversial premises of everyday morality, Moller needs to reject the enforceability of assistance without denying the underlying duty. It takes more powerful reasons to justify forcing someone to comply with a duty we think they are flouting than it does to justify the existence of the duty or its applicability to the case at hand. Moreover, some duties are harder to enforce fairly than others. Moller distinguishes perfect duties, which apply always and everywhere and have a specific target, from imperfect duties, which bind us to pursue a general goal, but not to specific actions with respect to particular persons (108). Imperfect duties are vaguer than perfect duties, making it more difficult to determine when they have been fulfilled. Although "rare, face-to-face emergencies" could give rise to perfect duties of rescue, such duties won't justify the main activities of the welfare state (109). This combination of a higher justificatory bar and epistemic difficulty explains why a neighbor might rightly intervene to stop my wealthy cousin from abusing her child, but not to force her to give more to charity (114).

By this point, Moller has justified use of force in the service of all but only the functions characteristic of the minimal state. One of these functions is to redress rights violations. Moller describes the history of European and American involvement in colonialism and slavery as "a compendium of evil" (220), a natural judgment for a theory that takes seriously claims to self-ownership. Moller accepts that recent state wrongs give rise to legitimate claims to reparations, as in the case of the federal government's discriminatory housing and lending policies in the 20th Century (222). In such cases, the state itself wronged still-living individuals, and so owes them compensation. Moller also accepts that where specific objects have been stolen, such as a particular piece of land or a work of art, restitution may be owed a long time after, from inheritors of wrongdoers to descendants of the victims (225-6). However, he questions whether claims to money or other non-specific assets survive the passage of long periods of time. Proponents of reparations for distant wrongs argue that each succeeding generation inherits the ill-gotten gains of the previous. Current owners can therefore be liable to restore some of this wealth to those disadvantaged by the historic injustice (225). Moller's response is that current wealth is mostly not inherited from the distant past (217-8). War and other cataclysms break the line of inheritance; immigration and population growth dilute it (228-9). Most importantly, the wealth of today is not primarily a product of distant past wealth, but of present social and economic conditions (229-30). Moller concludes that reparations are "clearly" owed to African Americans for "still-recent injustices," but not "massive redistribution" for the legacy of the slave trade (230).

Moller adopts a similar line on proposals for redistribution from rich to poor countries. The injustices of colonialism are not one of the main causes of current economic disparities between countries. It used to be that all countries were poor, now only some are (184-7). The social and economic processes that first led some then many countries to experience sustained high levels of growth, unprecedented in human history, are largely independent of colonialism; many countries became rich without colonies, while others became rich despite their colonies, while the end of colonial activity had little effect on growth (196-8). The injustices involved were grave, but their effects on the production of wealth were "trivial compared to the real drivers of growth" (198).

The book is an impressive achievement. It makes a plausible and coherent defense of a reasonable, attractive form of libertarianism. It's clearly and engagingly written. I've tried to convey the core argument, but the book includes a number of interesting discussions, of which I'll mention just two. Chapter 10 aims to resolve the Easterlin paradox, which is that high income is associated with greater happiness within societies but not between them. Moller argues that the paradox must eventually be real, if it is not already (there is some empirical dispute about this), because our capacity for economic development is enormous, while our capacity for increased happiness is permanently limited by factors such as envy and heartache. Growth remains important, however, because we have reason to care about things other than (our own) happiness (162). The book also includes an even-handed discussion of political correctness, acknowledging the importance of not insulting or demeaning historically marginalized groups, but insisting that the overzealous pursuit of this goal poses genuine dangers, such as limiting empirical understanding, engendering preference falsification, and encouraging wishful thinking (as in the case of "moral modus tollens," where moral beliefs drive inferences about cause and effect; 276-7).

I would like to make three critical points about Moller's position. The first concerns the insurance rationale for the welfare state. Although Moller says that insurance is "one of the better strategies" for justifying the welfare state (79), he doesn't explain the market failure argument that lies behind this rationale. When consumers of insurance have more information about their riskiness than do providers, adverse selection can lead to a collapse of private insurance markets (Heath 2009, 93, 137). There is thus a case for forcing people to purchase insurance, if not for a single provider system, not for the sake of redistribution but to solve a collective action problem. This rationale won't justify the extent of redistribution normally carried out by welfare states, which typically build some redistribution into employment and other insurance schemes by charging non-actuarial premiums (Heath 2009, 290-1). Modern economies involve other forms of insurance, however. Bankruptcy protection and limited liability for investors are forms of social insurance, paid for by slightly higher interest rates on loans (Heath 2009, 41-2). Such practices are not strictly consensual; limited liability for harm to third parties could only be created by the state (Singer 2018, 183). They are good for business, however, and for general prosperity.

The second issue concerns the enforcement of assistance. Moller acknowledges the existence of an assurance rationale for mandatory aid; "without a compulsory system, we have no way of knowing that we are not 'suckers' contributing aid while others shirk their duty" (117). Yet he denies that other people's failure to fulfill their duties gives me license to neglect mine (118). This presentation of the issue focuses on unfairness between duty-holders, as when A and B but not C fulfill their duties to assist D, disadvantaging A and B relative to C. However, the more relevant issue is lack of reciprocity between duty-holder and beneficiary, as when A assists B, but B wouldn't assist A, were their situations reversed. It is presumably true that our most basic rights are not forfeitable by misconduct, and the associated duties not conditional on reciprocity. If the duty of assistance were conditional, however, enforcement would permit us to comply with the duty without doing more than necessary for the non-compliant. Having accepted use of force in order to permit consumption of public goods without exploitation by free-riders, it's not clear that Moller can reject use of force to permit fulfillment of duty without exploitation by free-riders.

The third and most fundamental concern I would like to raise is a baseline problem. It's only unfair to shift a burden if it's in the right place to begin with, so a constraint on burden-shifting cannot be fundamental. Everyone will agree that we should be loathe to use force to shift burdens that have arisen via voluntary choice within the confines of just institutions; the question is what constitutes just institutions. It's wrong to override someone's legitimate entitlements without a very special justification (plus satisfaction of residual obligations). Yet the determination of what can be privately owned, of what rights ownership involves, and of how ownership can pass down through the generations -- these are questions that must be answered by appeal to principles of justice. Among these principles could be one limiting inequalities of opportunity between the different social positions into which one can be born, or maximizing the minimum level of real opportunity. If so, the state would not be infringing property rights by taxing income to fund education. For people's property rights would only be (fully) justified if the appropriate tax policies were in place. Thus when asked by Nozick to pick a distribution of holdings, any distribution (Nozick 1974, 160), egalitarians respond by asking what rights are involved in holding something (Ryan 1977, 132), and we insist that no distribution of holdings is just, not even if perfectly equal, if the holdings are immune from the taxation required to fund the education system that is necessary for equal opportunity, or maximizing the level of the lowest social position.

Moller says that we are to use only reason and persuasion to achieve our distributive aims, not force, but why doesn't the enforcement of property rights count as a distributive aim? It's not clear what basis there is for the asymmetrical treatment of the use of force in maintaining as opposed to changing a given set of holdings. A redistributive welfare state changes the distribution of burdens, compared to not having such a state, but then so too does the enforcement of property rights, compared to not enforcing these rights, or compared to enforcing a different system of property rights. Moller rightly forces our attention on the question of when it is justified to use force to compel our fellow citizens to serve values we think important but that they don't share, or that they interpret/apply differently. But the same question can be asked about the enforcement of property rights. Under what conditions it is justified to threaten violence to exclude others from land or resources? One of these conditions might be the existence of a redistributive welfare state. Indeed, if private property is so important, there is a case for having a redistributive welfare state so as to ensure that everyone enjoys a real and not too unequal opportunity to acquire property, no matter where in society or to whom they are born. It could be one of the conditions of just claims to private property that one put a portion of one's income at the service of the community, in the service of goals such as equal or maximin opportunity.

The libertarian argument (28, 38, 100) only says that it's wrong to appropriate property to which others are entitled. Moller argues that I can override your property rights to save someone's life (incurring residual obligations), but not to educate them. However, it could be a condition for you to have just property rights, and for you to be justified in enforcing them, that you contribute to the funding of education for all. If it's wrong to forcibly appropriate, it's also wrong to use force in defence of claims to property to which people are not entitled. Of course, property claims can be legitimate even if not fully just. The fact that an economic system is slightly unjust can't justify taking away people's houses. But changing the system to make it more just is not wrongful appropriation, at least not if it's done with appropriate warning, grandfathering, and so on. We should be reluctant to violate existing rules of property, even in the service of important social objectives. But the more basic question is about how we define the rules of property, and the conditions under which it is justified to enforce a given set of rules.

I think Moller must be right that we have moral claims to differential control over things beyond the reach of social and legal norms. However, we also have moral claims against differential control, and against too absolute an interpretation of these rights of control. The moral basis of property includes reasons for limiting the rights that ownership of property brings and the extent of private property a person can accumulate. It is essential to my owning something that I have some control over it that others lack; it is not essential that the income I derive from this property be immune from taxation except to provide public goods, nor that this control extend after my death (though there are good reasons for permitting some inheritance). While property claims clearly have a moral basis, and exist outside or prior to social conventions, it's not clear to me that these claims condemn the welfare state, nor that they prevent adoption of policies required by broadly egalitarian principles of social justice.


Thanks to Rahul Kumar for comments on the first draft of this review.


Heath, Joseph. 2009. Filthy Lucre: Economics for People Who Hate Capitalism. Harper Collins Publishers.

Nozick, Robert. 1974. Anarchy, State, and Utopia. Basic Books.

Ryan, Cheyney. 1977. "Yours, Mine, and Ours: Property Rights and Individual Liberty," in Ethics, Vol. 87, pp.126-141.

Singer, Abraham A. 2019. The Form of the Firm. Oxford University Press.