Grand Theories and Everyday Beliefs: Science, Philosophy, and Their Histories

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Wallace Matson, Grand Theories and Everyday Beliefs: Science, Philosophy, and Their Histories, Oxford University Press, 2011, 240pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199812691.

Reviewed by Robert Pasnau and Joseph Stenberg, University of Colorado at Boulder


Wallace Matson died this past spring after a long career teaching at UC Berkeley. His last book is a sweeping, provocative essay on the history of philosophy and much else besides, running all the way from the Big Bang to the end of intelligent life on earth. Although written for a popular audience, it contains much that might interest professional philosophers. It also contains much that might infuriate that same audience.

The core project of the book is to answer the Demarcation Problem: How do we separate beliefs that "we have at least some reason to think correspond to the way things really are" from "all the rest?" (5) The resources of evolutionary theory are brought to bear in his response and the history of philosophy and science serves as the backdrop on which Matson sketches a series of worldviews that represent advances, missteps, and failures with respect to establishing a view of things based on the way things (almost certainly) actually are. Along the way, Matson embarks on brief excursions into political theory and ethics and weighs in on various issues in contemporary philosophy, such as the nature of modality and the problem of induction.

Matson's heroes are those philosophers and scientists who have embraced an empirical, naturalistic picture of the world, and his villains those philosophers and theologians who have departed from empiricism or naturalism. His aim is to tell a story, accessible to almost anyone, about what is right about science, wrong about theology, and how philosophers sometimes get it right and sometimes go wrong.

Readers' potential enthusiasm for this book might be gauged by how well they respond to pronouncements from on high such as: "the Iliad and the Odyssey . . . were the first works of European literature and are still its greatest" (66); Plato's Republic and Spinoza's Ethics are "indisputably . . . the two greatest single philosophical works" (104); Berkeley is a "clown" who "fills his pages with absurdities" (175). Others may be left wondering whether thirty-five years of lecturing can breed too much confidence in one's own opinions.

The book is divided into three parts, arranged chronologically. The first offers, in effect, a natural history of belief, from single-celled organisms to the rise of agriculture. This section aims at an evolutionary explanation for why Robert Frost was right in saying, "To err is human, not to, animal" (38). Matson's story hinges upon his distinction between low and high beliefs. A low belief is a belief formed "in an encounter with the thing or situation that the belief is about" (41). A high belief is "any belief formed in some other manner," particularly, by way of testimony or exercising the imagination (41). The low beliefs of non-human animals and human societies are almost all true because "having true beliefs is highly correlated with doing the right things," where "the right things" are things that aid in coping (42). The high beliefs of human societies, however, which are peculiar to humans because of the sophisticated sort of language we employ, are almost all false. The worst offenders here, of course, are religion and certain kinds of philosophy.

The book's second part runs from Thales to the advent of Christianity. Here Matson introduces what he takes to be the three pillars of the scientific worldview: monism, the view that "there is only one kind of reality, the everyday world" (198), naturalism, the view that all changes within the everyday world are effects of causes internal to the everyday world (70), and rationalism, the acceptance of the principle of sufficient reason, that "there is a sufficient reason why everything that is, is so and not otherwise" (70). Since he associates these three pillars with Thales and his followers, he dubs them the Milesian principles.

Most of the section is spent tracing various advances, missteps, and failures in the time period with respect to these three requirements. In his usual bold way, Matson tells us that Thales was "the greatest scientist of all time" (119), inasmuch as he was the innovator who gave the world "the first worldview based on low beliefs" (69). His history of ancient philosophy proceeds by noting how various thinkers of the period either upheld or gave up on monism, naturalism, and rationalism. What is most interesting about this material is the surprising weight he gives to certain aspects of the story at the expense of other aspects. Thales and the subsequent Milesian tradition is assigned the starring role, whereas Plato is treated as a peripheral figure inasmuch as he rejected all three of the pillars of science (111). Aristotle is a step back in the right direction and comes in second place among great scientists (after Thales, of course), but his philosophy is valuable chiefly for its logic.

Even if one is sympathetic to this way of telling the story, Matson's historical methods are frequently doubtful. Among his reasons for such enthusiasm about Thales, for instance, are that "he invented geometrical proof" and "he predicted 'the very year' in which a solar eclipse would occur in his part of the world" (66). Although such assertions are indeed found among the reports concerning Thales's life, scholars doubt the veracity of both claims. Even a popular work such as this ought to adhere to a higher standard of scholarship. (In this connection, too, Matson might have provided at least the occasional reference note for readers wanting to pursue his claims further.)

The third part of the book is entitled "The Legacy of Christianity." Matson had signaled at the start where his sympathies lie in this regard, remarking that "the impact of Christianity on the Greek intellectual world was like that of an asteroid hitting the earth" (6). Later we are told in slightly less florid terms that Christians "tried to stamp out" philosophy (134). Such remarks are unbearably crude, on one hand neglecting the complex reasons why Greek philosophy had been on the decline long before Christianity came into power, and on the other hand ignoring the many ways in which Christian thought fostered philosophy. (To say nothing of Islam, where Greek philosophy was first nurtured in the post-classical world.)

Yet even if his historical scholarship is shaky, Matson's reasons for hostility toward Christianity are interesting. Christians inherited from Judaism the belief in an omnipotent and ultimately inscrutable God. This undermines all three of the Milesian principles: such a God introduces a supernatural reality, a causally open world, and a being to whom the principle of sufficient reason does not apply (135). Less obviously, but crucially, the rejection of the Milesian worldview brought about two further philosophical mistakes. First, "anything imaginable can happen, should the Omnipotent Creator and Legislator (henceforth OCL) see fit to make it happen" and so "no informative statement about the world can be a necessary truth" (136). Second, "the regular behaviors of things are to be conceived and explained in terms of obedience to laws decreed by the OCL" (136). With the first of these came the notion of the logically possible; the only states of affairs that cannot be otherwise are those involving self-contradictions. This leads in turn, via the second mistake, to the misguided doctrine that the world is contingent.

Predictably, Matson has nothing good to say about medieval thought, but he is also critical toward many seventeenth and eighteenth-century figures, largely because of their embrace of these last two doctrines. Descartes, for instance, rests his dualism on mistaken ideas about logical possibility. Even worse is his Evil Demon, which again presupposes the wrong views about possibility and the contingency of the world. Matson's historical scholarship is again doubtful: he tells us that "it is incontrovertible fact that doubt about the existence of the 'external world' was an attitude not taken by anyone before Descartes" (202, original emphasis). But as usual Matson is interesting even when tendentious. Here is why the Evil Demon is not a genuine problem for philosophy:

The Evil Demon ploy demands that before we can justifiably claim to know that p, we must already, before making that claim, have ruled out as impossible every circumstance such that if it obtained, p would be false; and, it avers, Here is one such circumstance. But we can, antecedently to any inquiry, rule out the possibility of our being deceived by an evil demon. This is because we know that there are no evil demons (147).

This much is a familiar line of response. What Matson adds to the story is this:

No question is begged in this response, even though if we were being deceived by an evil demon, we wouldn't know it, by hypothesis. For as things stand, we have overwhelming evidence that there are no evil demons, and none at all that there are or could be. Unless our worldview already allowed a priori for the existence of omnipotent beings, there could be no reason whatsoever for raising this question (147).

Again it is the rise of the Christian worldview that has led philosophy astray.

Post-Cartesian philosophy gets graded according to its fidelity to the Milesian principles. Hobbes scores well, and Spinoza even better: not only is his Ethics "the greatest single work in philosophy," but moreover "most of the statements in it are true" (165). Hume, in contrast, comes out as something of a misguided genius. Many of his philosophical tendencies are ones that Matson feels sympathy with, but Hume made the crucial mistake of embracing the contingency-of-the-world doctrine. Accordingly, Hume doubts whether there are genuine causes and effects in the world, and wrongly supposes there is a problem with induction (174). In fact, "the Problem of Induction vanishes once the notion of 'logical possibility' as a kind of real possibility is given up" (175). So too "the Problems of Personal Identity, Mind/Body, Other Minds, and Knowledge of the External World likewise fade out . . . once the notion is abandoned that the Foundations of Knowledge must lie in solipsistic subjectivity" (175). Given that this list of topics sets the agenda for much of modern philosophy, Matson is understandably exercised about the state of the discipline, and he continues from the previous quotation with something more than his customary warmth:

Yet these puerile topics persist in colleges as staples of Philosophy 101, the lecturer having to pretend that there is something almost ineffably profound about them. This is a disgrace to philosophy, which, whatever else it may be, should deal first with first and last things (175).

These are strong words on behalf of a claim that Matson defends very quickly, with only the sketchiest of supporting arguments.

What ultimately seems to drive Matson's thinking here is the genealogical point that the notion of logical possibility is tainted by its origins in religious belief. One might wonder whether this is historically accurate, or whether the origins of the thesis even matter. But Matson thinks that logical possibility counts as genuine possibility only if God exists, since in that case all such possibilities would open up as real possibilities, in virtue of God's power. This gives the atheist further reason not to take such possibilities seriously. But this is a double-edged sword, because Matson concedes that God "may exist, as many people, including philosophers, believe, in which case logical possibility is a kind of possibility" (201). If, however, God's existence is a real possibility, then it would seem that logical possibilities are also real. Inasmuch as we cannot rule out God's existence, it would then accordingly seem that we cannot so easily rid ourselves of worries about the problem of induction, skepticism about the external world, and so on.

If Matson saves his harshest words for philosophy rather than religion, that is only because he regards the latter as a horse scarcely worth flogging: "Christianity, despite continuing political influence in Ireland, the United States, and elsewhere, is now intellectually defunct" (190). Even so, Matson's central idea -- his high/low belief distinction -- is meant to show us where we went wrong, in embracing religion. A close look at how his distinction actually gets drawn, however, reveals that the status of theism is not nearly as clear as Matson's dismissive remarks suggest.

To see how this is so, one needs to attend to a crucial and very interesting epicycle that he introduces into the theory. Early on, Matson acknowledges that high beliefs can scarcely be rejected across the board, since in that case any belief formed without an encounter with the thing or situation that the belief is about would have to be rejected. This is unacceptable, since it is central to the scientific project to frame hypotheses about theoretical or inferred entities that cannot always be encountered in the right sort of way (at least at the time they are inferred). Therefore, if high beliefs were rejected altogether, the scientific project could not be carried out. To address this worry, Matson introduces the notion of tethering. Tethering is supposed to explain, for example, why we should applaud Aristotle's having hypothesized that the earth is a sphere before having a great deal of evidence for this conclusion, whereas we should not applaud Plato's postulation of Ideas. The difference, Matson argues, lies in the verifiability of Aristotle's hypothesis and the impossibility of verifying Plato's. In other words, tethered hypotheses "are candidates for low-beliefhood" whereas untethered hypotheses are not (220).

Matson's criticism of theism, then, must turn not just on its being a high belief, but on its being an untethered high belief. This is precisely his view -- indeed, he goes much further than that, arguing not just that "theology is not a variant of science," but also that it is not "in any way the product of the same basic intellectual impulse" (107). This last claim seems absurdly overstated. Even if it is true that theology is not a variant of science, and even if the methods employed by theologians and scientists are not equally reliable, still it is easy to see respects in which both programs have the same aim. Most obviously, they both aim at true beliefs (or something like it), and, moreover, they aim at true beliefs that explain fundamental features of the world.

So is theology a variant of science? One of the payoffs of Matson's book is that, instead of asking that ill-defined question, we can ask the more sharply framed question of whether at least a certain class of theistic claims may be thought of as tethered high beliefs. Although Matson does not like the theistic hypothesis -- clashing as it does with every one of the Milesian principles -- it is not clear that he has good reason to deny that certain versions of that hypothesis may count as tethered. When Aquinas, for example, argues that God (or an intelligent designer) exists, he seems to be engaged in the same sort of reasoning that validates Aristotle's inference with respect to the shape of the earth -- namely, reasoning from various effects seen in the world to beliefs about what we cannot (at least for now) directly experience. Matson might still insist that the theistic hypothesis is unverifiable, which is of course a familiar complaint. But given the vagaries of what counts as verification, it again seems tendentious to insist, categorically, that all religious belief is untethered.

Grand Theories is, in short, a maddening book, but never a dull book. Perhaps it will only really be appreciated by those who share Matson's Milesian inclinations. But, despite its flaws, we should all appreciate the effort taken to write it, because philosophy needs more such books.