Grandstanding: The Use and Abuse of Moral Talk


Justin Tosi and Brandon Warmke, Grandstanding: The Use and Abuse of Moral Talk, Oxford University Press, 2020, 226pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190900151.

Reviewed by Evan Westra, York University


Justin Tosi and Brandon Warmke's book aims to explain why contemporary public moral discourse feels so undeniably antagonistic, polarized, and cruel. Drawing on a wide range of evidence from philosophy, psychology, and political science, the authors argue that this unsavory state of affairs stems in part from the pervasive abuse of moral speech in the pursuit of social status, or moral grandstanding. The book is engagingly written, extensively researched, and it offers a clear philosophical analysis of a social phenomenon that we often encounter in our everyday lives. While I feel the pull of the overall thesis, I am not yet convinced that grandstanding is really a significant cause of the problems the book sets out to diagnose. I also worry that focusing on the evils of grandstanding will not improve the quality of public moral discourse, and that it actually poses its own moral hazard.

Chapters 1 through 3 introduce the notion of moral grandstanding. Chapter 1 begins by giving a broad definition of the domain of moral talk and its central functions. Here, the authors argue that moral talk is something that should be treated with reverence and deployed sparingly, not something that we should constantly resort to for every potential problem. Chapter 2 presents the "basic account" of moral grandstanding. Grandstanding, in this view, consists of two components: a Recognition Desire and a Grandstanding Expression. A Recognition Desire is a desire to be seen in a positive moral light by others, either as morally exceptional or simply as morally decent. Grandstanding Expressions are attempts to satisfy the Recognition Desire by engaging in moral talk. Chapter 3 offers a "field guide" to illustrate the shapes grandstanding takes out in the real world. This list includes piling on, when a grandstander contributes to public moral discourse to do nothing more than proclaim her agreement with what has already been said; ramping up, when grandstanders exaggerate their moral claims in order to appear more morally sensitive than their peers; trumping up, when grandstanders moralize a previously non-moral issue; and strong emotions, when grandstanders display excessive levels of moral outrage.

Chapters 4 through 6 present arguments for the immorality of grandstanding based on consequentialist, deontological, and virtue-ethical considerations. The consequentialist considerations against grandstanding are that it adds to political polarization and that it makes public moral discourse less effective by devaluing the currency of moral talk. The deontological argument against grandstanding focuses on the way that grandstanders use people who have committed some perceived wrong as a mere means to make themselves appear morally respectable. The authors also argue that grandstanders deceive members of their audience about their true moral character. The virtue-ethical argument against grandstanding focuses on the egoistic nature of the Recognition Desire, which is analyzed as a failure of civic virtue. This chapter also ends with a hedged Nietzschean analysis of grandstanding as a form of "slave morality."

Chapter 7 focuses on the effects of grandstanding on our politics. The authors argue that politicians and other political actors have strong incentives to engage in grandstanding, because their electoral success depends upon their being perceived as morally righteous. This leads political actors to eschew compromise in favor of rigid ideological purity, and motivates them to endorse expressive but otherwise ineffectual policies. Part of the chapter is also devoted to criticizing excessive grandstanding among political activists and activist organizations.

The final chapter of the book asks what, if anything, can be done about grandstanding. Here, the authors make a few modest suggestions for how readers might endeavor to abstain from grandstanding themselves, drawing on research on strategies for self-control. The book ends on the tentative suggestion that we might change the social norms surrounding moral grandstanding by educating people about its negative effects, by depriving grandstanders of social rewards, and by setting a good example for others.

The strength of the book is in its analysis of the concept of moral grandstanding itself. The phenomenon of grandstanding is no doubt familiar and intuitive to most readers, but up until quite recently, this phenomenon had not been the subject of philosophical scrutiny. The basic account offered in Chapter 2 does a good job of explaining what moral grandstanding is in a way that makes it clear why it can be morally problematic. The authors' analysis also draws helpful connections between the concept of grandstanding and relevant research in social psychology, which makes for a particularly clear portrait of a certain kind of bad social behavior. There are some points in this analysis that deserve further scrutiny: for example, the idea that a desire to be seen as morally respectable by one's peers is necessarily a desire to be seen as superior to others ignores other more egalitarian forms of moral recognition that people might desire. There are also perfectly legitimate reasons to value the respect of one's peers that are not discussed. But on the whole, the analysis articulated in this book should serve as a useful framework for other philosophers working on the ethics of public discourse.

One notable thing about Tosi and Warmke's basic account of grandstanding is that, on their account, grandstanding can be a very subtle psychological phenomenon. Because people often act from mixed motives, Recognition Desires can coexist alongside more praiseworthy motivations. Recognition Desires can also be unconscious, and avoid detection even upon introspection. Tosi and Warmke further note that Grandstanding Expressions are often perfectly sincere, and that the claims made by grandstanders can also be true and justified, regardless of their underlying motives. And because Recognition Desires are unobservable psychological states, it is often difficult to tell whether or not a given speech act really is a Grandstanding Expression. For all we know, any speech act could either be an instance of grandstanding or a completely benign and well-intentioned contribution to the discourse. All of this would seem to suggest that one is not often in an epistemic position to know anything about grandstanding, let alone its effects on complex social phenomena like polarization.

Such epistemic caution is not reflected in many of the book's assertions about the consequences of grandstanding or the actual characteristics of grandstanders, however. After articulating their basic account, the authors go on to confidently describe the psychology of grandstanders, provide a catalogue of the different manifestations of grandstanding, and make strong claims about its societal effects. In their broader account, grandstanding is a narrative thread that ties together a wide range of everyday evils that we observe on social media and in our politics with empirical findings from political science and social psychology. In striking contrast to the nuanced picture laid out in the basic account, the grandstanding actors who feature in this narrative do not have mixed motives, and are often straightforwardly malicious. In this account, the murky epistemology of grandstanding is not a reason to be circumspect in our inferences about grandstanding, but instead a reason to be even more alarmed about its insidious effects on society: grandstanding is all the more dangerous because it masquerades as sincere moral discourse.

When we take the authors' earlier claims about the subtlety of grandstanding seriously, it seems like we also should be skeptical of their conclusions about how it manifests itself in practice and the effects that it has on society. The central narrative of the book notwithstanding, it is not clear that grandstanding really explains any of the toxic behaviors that the authors set out to diagnose. Take the phenomena of piling on and online shaming. How do we know that the participants in a particular pile-on are likely to be motivated by status, and not by their genuine (if misguided and harmful) moral outrage? And why think that -- in one of the book's more memorable examples -- the online commenter who told Anita Sarkeesian "I hope you get cancer" was really acting out of a desire for status as opposed to sincerely held misogynistic beliefs, as Sarkeesian herself argues? Even if we can be reasonably confident that at least some of these people are motivated by Recognition Desires (as the authors assert, when confronting a similar objection), how do we know that it is this feature of their psychology that drives processes like polarization, and not genuine disagreements and conflicting worldviews -- or, for that matter, broader structural facts about the social institutions in which grandstanders are embedded? Despite the impressive breadth of the research cited, many of the core claims about the consequences of grandstanding remain highly conjectural.

The plausibility of these grand causal claims often seems to depend upon the reader's ability to compartmentalize them away from the authors' own careful qualifications about the complexity of grandstanding as a psychological phenomenon. This compartmentalization is made easier by the fact that the book frequently appeals to cases of grandstanding that are also morally problematic for other reasons. For instance, the book's first explicit case of grandstanding focuses on a statement made by the Hollywood mogul Harvey Weinstein shortly after he was exposed as a serial sexual harasser and rapist. In the statement, Weinstein attempts to deflect attention by vowing to redouble his efforts in promoting progressive causes. Clearly, this was a transparent attempt by Weinstein to use moral talk to protect his reputation. But arguably, it was not Weinstein's desire to protect his reputation that made this particular act morally repugnant, but his failure to issue a proper apology -- not to mention the fact that he is a serial sexual harasser and rapist. That Weinstein was grandstanding in this case is morally incidental. These appeals to "comorbid" cases make it difficult to distinguish our intuitions about grandstanding from our intuitions about more familiar moral vices, such as cruelty and misogyny.

A similar problem arises in the book's inconsistent treatment of the relationship between grandstanding and deception. At several points, the authors claim that it would be wrong to think of grandstanding as a form of insincerity, warning that such a "fixation on insincerity is myopic" (40) and assuring readers that "grandstanders are usually sincere" (106). Despite these assurances, the authors frequently emphasize the deceptiveness of grandstanders in their examples, and repeatedly draw analogies to lying to support their arguments. Of course, nobody would dispute the fact that being dishonest about moral matters in order to enhance one's status is wrong. But this does little to show why, as the authors put it, "some of the most serious problems with moral grandstanding occur because grandstanders are so often sincere" (40). In their defense, the authors could argue that lying and other vicious behaviors are really the predictable downstream consequences of attempting to satisfy Recognition Desires; however, such an argument would require evidence that is not presented in the book.

This rhetorical reliance upon the worst imaginable cases of grandstanding reflects a missed opportunity. The book might have been even more philosophically compelling had it spent a bit more time on the complex and interesting case of the sincere grandstander with mixed, unconscious motives hinted at in Chapter 2, instead of relying upon one-dimensional moral caricatures. Convincing readers to hate such individuals is quite easy, but it is not particularly enlightening. If the aim of this book is to get readers to refrain from grandstanding themselves, then grandstanders need to be portrayed in a way that readers might actually recognize in the mirror.

The tenuous epistemology of grandstanding also lends itself to another problematic feature of the book: it provides its readers with a ready-made cynical lens through which they can interpret almost any act of public moral discourse as grandstanding. If the book's bolder claims are to be taken seriously, and if grandstanding really is all around us, then it would be perfectly understandable for readers to infer that many of the specific behaviors they see in their everyday lives are instances of grandstanding as well, and to react accordingly. But of course, these inferences about grandstanding are prone to all the biases that the authors argue contribute to grandstanding in the first place, from in-group preferences to moral self-enhancement. Add this to the epistemic obstacles to detecting grandstanding, and you get a recipe for false positives.

This is perhaps why the authors make it clear that they do not recommend simply accusing others of grandstanding (although they do argue that it is permissible to condemn grandstanders in more indirect, oblique ways). Instead, they suggest that we must first and foremost ask whether we ourselves are guilty of grandstanding, and try hard to refrain from contributing to the problem further. This is good advice. But here too, the book strikes a dissonant chord. By far, the majority of the book is devoted to a harsh description of what grandstanding looks like in other people. Only about five pages in the final chapter are devoted to the question of how not to grandstand oneself. This makes their warning against calling out grandstanders ring somewhat hollow. Despite the authors' best intentions, it is likely to be disregarded. Even if readers do not directly call out the grandstanders they believe to be all around them, they will still be inclined to interpret these people as insincerely attempting to gain status, rather than as making legitimate moral claims.

This is concerning. Perhaps the most challenging kind of moral talk that we encounter on a day-to-day basis involves fundamental disagreements about what morality requires of us. Moral progress depends upon our ability to recognize that certain things people once thought of as benign are in fact morally problematic. Recognizing and addressing these previously unnoticed wrongs often means listening to those with different moral perspectives, hearing things one does not want to hear, and engaging in the challenging task of questioning one's own moral beliefs. Interpreting someone expressing an unwelcome moral perspective as a grandstander making trumped-up moral claims and feigning outrage offers a convenient way to avoid these more effortful forms of moral reflection. I worry that some readers will find in the book a readymade philosophical and scientific justification for these convenient deflections, and that this could hinder important forms of moral learning and dialogue.

Tosi and Warmke are well aware of this concern, and of most other criticisms I've raised here. (Another notable feature of this book is that the authors have anticipated and pre-emptively responded to many of the objections that might occur to a skeptical reader.) Ultimately, they are much more concerned about the potential harms of grandstanding itself than they are about the risk that their framework might be abused, which they view as minimal. If you accept their arguments about grandstanding, then perhaps this calculation will seem to be correct. But if you instead find yourself dwelling upon the epistemic challenges that come with identifying grandstanders, or if you find that the inferences about their effects upon society require further evidence, then you might worry that the potential for abuse of the grandstanding concept is in fact the greater danger to public moral discourse.


I am grateful to Regina Rini, Alice MacLachlan, Michael Cust, and Daniel Rodrigues for helpful discussion and feedback as I prepared this review.