Greek Models of Mind and Self

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A. A. Long, Greek Models of Mind and Self, Harvard University Press, 2015, 228pp., $25.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674729032.

Reviewed by Paul Woodruff, The University of Texas at Austin


This book introduces its topic clearly to general readers, while, at the same time, bringing together a lifetime of thought and original research that will be useful to scholars of the subject. It is a small book with a huge range, sound and original in its scholarship. Beginners will read it as an introduction; philosophers of mind ought to read it in order to understand the history of their subject; classical scholars should read it for its insights into authors that might otherwise escape them. A Plato scholar, for example, may have missed important texts in Pindar or Isocrates, which A.A. Long uses to good effect. Even familiar texts, such as Plato's Gorgias, have implications for this topic that may surprise a scholar. In short, this book needs to be widely read. My cavils with it are only on small points and do not undermine the main arguments.

The earliest surviving Greek author, Homer, did not separate a person into body and soul, but considered each person to be what Long calls a "psychosomatic whole," which could not survive death. Using a famous line from Wordsworth as his second chapter heading, "intimations of immortality," Long finds early traces of the idea that the self is soul, and that it may survive death, in both poets and philosophers (Hesiod, Pindar, Pythagoras, Heraclitus, and Empedocles). The third chapter is a remarkable discussion of rhetoric and the soul, mainly in the work of Plato; its thesis is that Platonic soul-body dualism suits Plato's defense of philosophy against the seductions of rhetoric. The fourth follows Plato's Republic in exploring the idea that the soul should rule the body in the way a wise leader should rule a body politic, and the fifth deals with the Stoics, who see the ruling soul as a rational element affording each of us a stake in the divine and an opportunity for happiness.

The book is built on a series of lectures given at Renmin University in Beijing, in 2012, with the result that each of the five chapters is self-contained and presents a different model for mind and self. Each chapter treats its subject with respect; Long never presents an ancient model of the mind as primitive or as merely a stage in development leading toward a modern view. After all, we have no modern consensus on the nature of persons or of the mind. Each of the models Long discusses is interesting and attractive in its own right.

On Homer, Long must set aside the influence of Bruno Snell, whose book on the discovery of mind has had great influence. Homer (without presenting an explicit theory) assigns the functions of mind to various bodily organs -- diaphragm or lungs, heart, thumos -- in what Long calls a "cardiovascular" model. After death, only an insubstantial ghost (psyche) survives, and without a body this is not a person. A person simply is a body endowed through living organs with mental powers.

Long tries to make the Homeric model seem modern by citing Gilbert Ryle's Concept of Mind, which argues (on behaviorist grounds) against the dualist concept of mind as what Ryle called "the ghost in the machine." Long's mention of Ryle in connection with Homer is misleading. Homer is nothing like a behaviorist; he assigns mental functions to specific bodily organs, as does much of recent science -- and, indeed, much of common sense now, which sees no difference between mind and brain. A more interesting analogy would be with recent panpsychists, who insist on the potential of matter for consciousness. My one major complaint about Long's lectures is their innocence with regard to recent philosophy of mind. Ryle's book was published in 1949 and has long since fallen out of favor. But Long is right to ask his readers to take the Homeric model seriously, and not to dismiss it as primitive.

Homer's influence on classical Greek thought was deep. Long does not give much play to the tragic poets, but they represented ordinary Greek opinion as following the Homeric model. These poets wrote of human beings as "mortals," so that the very thought of immortality for human beings would have seemed transgressive, and, indeed irreverent in denying the wide gap between human and divine -- a gap that (in their view) had to be accepted by reverent people. Once philosophers began to claim immortality, by contrast with the poets, they were also claiming an element of divinity, with breathtaking consequences. To do this, they had to overcome the cultural obstacle of the Homeric tradition, which was alive and well in the theaters of Athens.

How did intimations of immortality creep into ancient Greek thought? On this topic, Long is especially interesting (Chapter 2), owing to his wide range of classical knowledge. Long brings out the importance of the moral turn in Hesiod, whose gods (unlike Homer's) are interested in the moral attributes of human beings. The moral turn leads to a concept of human identity as "fundamentally moral" (67). At the same time, Hesiod's fable of a declining succession of ages raises the thought that human beings may be fallen gods. Long finds intimations of immortality also in the classical poet Pindar along with a number of early philosophers who give more attention than Homer to the psyche. Homer never identifies a person with a psyche, but, since psyche is the one human element that survives death, if persons are to survive death, it is natural to think of them as identical to their psychai, which we can now translate as "souls" (75). The psyche then can be seen as the holder of moral attributes, and the way is ready for Plato's Socrates to argue that care of the soul is more important than care of the body. Long is trying to avoid a developmental approach, but he finds it hard to escape on this subject. Plato's novel claims did not come ex nihilo.

In Chapter 3, Long connects Plato's model of the self with his campaign to distinguish philosophy from rhetoric. It would have been useful here for Long to say more about the task Plato set himself in defining philosophical speaking and writing as a new genre, but the chapter is brilliant in its own terms and should be read with care by Plato scholars. As a teacher of rhetoric, Gorgias believed that the human psyche is vulnerable to persuasion by words, which he may have thought had a physical impact on the soul (101). Gorgias famously compares the power of words to the power of drugs in his Defense of Helen, but we should be more cautious than Long in supposing that Gorgias believes what he says in a speech in which he is showing off the range of arguments he can deploy.

Long overstates ancient Greek confidence in the power of rhetoric. Rhetorical exchanges in Greek tragic plays almost never have an effect on action, and in Thucydides' history the most artful speakers often fail. Thucydides praises Antiphon for his defense speech, but notes that Antiphon was convicted anyway (Thucydides 8.68). In general, Thucydides does not support the claim that speech influences action. When Sparta decided to go to war, it was fear, not persuasion that moved them to attack Athens (Thucydides 1.88), and when Sparta decided to execute the survivors of Plataea, it was self-interest, not the arguments of the speeches that made the difference (Thucydides 3.68.4). What Long says about Thucydides is half-right: indeed, Thucydides believes that people are not ruled by reason (as Long correctly implies), but he does not believe that "speeches can convince people to act against their best interests" (103). Nevertheless, Long is entirely right -- and I think he is the first to say this so clearly -- that Plato's separation of soul from body is to some extent motivated by the need to develop a less vulnerable model of the soul.

In response to the position he attributes to Gorgias and others, Long says that Plato will want to forge a concept of self that is at least potentially safe from the impact of words, and to do that he will need to separate body from soul more clearly than his predecessors had done and assign to the soul a rational function that would be capable of resisting seductive argument.

Long rightly expresses doubt about Plato's commitment to literal immortality (117), affirming instead "Plato's total commitment to the metaphysical and evaluative contrasts he draws between body and soul" (118). Dualism is fundamental to the stage in Plato's thought represented by Gorgias and Phaedo. But Plato turns to a political model for the soul, as Long shows in Chapter 4, which is mainly about the Republic. A reasoning faculty trained in mathematics is best suited to rule the body, just as the truly wise are best suited to ruling a community. This model leads Plato to divide the soul into rational and non-rational parts -- a move that will be resisted by the Stoics, who otherwise follow Plato in taking the soul to be the rightful ruler of a person.

An interesting question Long does not take up is this: does the whole of the divided soul survive death, or only the rational part? Long says that immortality pertains only to reason (153), but he has just then discussed the myth in the Phaedrus, which attaches non-rational desires to the image of the disembodied chariot-soul as horses. Non-rational desires have no obvious place in a disembodied soul, but Plato does not seem to have addressed this difficulty. Long closes this chapter with a brief look at Aristotle's psychology.

Long's discussion of the Stoics (Chapter 5) is especially fruitful, based as it is on his deep knowledge of the Stoic texts. He draws on his recent translation of Epictetus, which sets a high standard for the translation of philosophy. In Stoic theory, every natural body has divinity in it, but human beings have a unique ability to recognize the divine element in themselves and to exercise volition in relation to the divine plan. Happiness lies in voluntarily, and by means of reason, bringing one's volition into line with the god in us and around us. In this way, happiness, reason, and divinity all come together. Because the god is in us, when we align ourselves with the god, we align ourselves with ourselves. In swearing allegiance to the god, "we swear to put ourselves ahead of everything else" (180, Epictetus Discourse 1.14). This self, to which Stoics declare allegiance, is a far cry from the Homeric self that cannot be separated from its own distinct, mortal body. But it remains a distinct self; it is not lost in a merger with the surrounding divine. Each person has a personal share of the divine -- "this faculty of positive and negative volition" (184, Epictetus Discourse 1.1). And this faculty is distinctive of the person for Stoics.