Greek Political Thought

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Ryan K. Balot, Greek Political Thought, Blackwell Publishing, 2006, 353pp., $30.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405100303.

Reviewed by Steven Skultety, University of Mississippi


In the Introduction to Greek Political Thought, Balot states that his new book is meant to accomplish three goals: it should (1) help students by filling the vacant niche of introductions to Greek political thought, (2) teach students how to read ancient texts by using a method that is both historical and normative, and (3) demonstrate to scholars that the whole of Greek political thought can be fruitfully read from a virtue ethics perspective -- indeed, that we can think of the Greeks as engaged in a "virtue politics" that is not only intrinsically interesting, but directly relevant to contemporary thought.  He seeks to meet these goals over the course of eight chapters in which interpretations of all major and important minor figures are provided, as well as analyses of major themes in ancient political history.

Like his wonderful Greed and Injustice in Classical Athens, this book clearly shows that Balot has an absolute command over a very wide range of subjects, and that he has continued to develop his extremely interesting intuition that it is through the ancient conception of justice and its centrality in political life that ancient thinkers are particularly relevant to contemporary thought. But beyond continuing this theme, Greek Political Thought is brimming with new insights, filled with genuinely helpful connections, and I found it to be a pleasure to read.  Given that this work is primarily intended as an introduction to a diverse range of topics, rather than a sustained defense of one specific thesis, I will begin by providing a very brief gloss of each chapter to give readers a sense of what they would be recommending to their students by assigning this book or any of its chapters, and then end the review by critically evaluating how well Balot meets his own three stated goals.


After beginning with a chapter that announces that this is a book about political thought rather than political theory (and thus concerned with a broad set of notions related to power and community instead of focused upon the systematic schemes of philosophers), Balot goes on in the second chapter to reconstruct the intellectual political repertoire of Greece as it emerged from the Dark Ages.  In whatever other ways they disagreed, Archaic Greeks assumed that a flourishing human community had to have an agreed-upon answer to the question "who gets what?"  Within the context of polis development and emerging conceptions of citizenship, this question was soon understood to depend on another: "who is equal to whom?"  The archaic answers to this latter question more or less map out the basic theories of Greek distributive justice: nature itself ranks heroic elites over lowly commoners (Homer), the diligence and thrift of average citizens justifies a share in power (this is called the "egalitarian response" of Hesiod), superior intellect and refined habits suggest aristocratic rule (the "elitist" response of the competitive rich); collective military enterprises recommend some sort of egalitarianism (Sparta); and, finally, while all citizens deserve some basic level of mutual respect, it is the individual who excels in civic virtue that deserves a heightened status among his peers (the innovation of Solon).

Chapter Three introduces us to Balot's conception of what was distinctive in the politics of democratic Athens.  The simple sketch is familiar enough: the conceptual pillars of ancient democracy were the notions of equality and freedom.  Yet here Balot does a particularly nice job of drawing out the complexities of the ancient versions of these two ideas without fragmenting his analysis with an endless number of qualifications.  Ancient democratic equality entailed both a normative social commitment to providing a wide range of opportunities, as well as a descriptive claim that citizens bore a natural similarity to one another.  Freedom did not only mean that citizens had a legal opportunity to live a life free from the commands of others, but also that they were enmeshed in a distinctive system of psychological pressures that carried citizens into public life.  Throughout this chapter, Balot does an admirable job of avoiding less interesting yes/no questions about whether ancient conceptions of citizenship met this or that abstract hurdle (e.g. "were ancient democrats free?") and instead asks more fruitful questions of degree that rank ancient democracies vis-a-vis other ancient political systems (e.g. "how much negative freedom did Athenians have vis-a-vis Spartans?").

Of course this democratic approach to politics did not please everyone, and Balot devotes one chapter to 5th century democratic critics, and then another to those of the 4th century, separating the two with a chapter on imperialism.  All of these critics found themselves in an awkward position: in spite of Athens' political upheavals and military blunders, it was clear that the democratic system was largely successful, more or less stable, and capable of great acts of virtue (such as the amnesty of 404).  Thus, critics of democracy had to come up with something far more penetrating than noble distain or vague talk of an impending social crisis.  In general, the 5th century critical attacks of Chapter Four end up being rather feckless.  The Old Oligarch's oddly respectful criticisms end up doing more harm than good to his own cause, and while some revolutionary oligarchs could perhaps have used a radicalization of the nomos/phusis distinction to cast doubt on democratic rule of law, they would have thereby undercut their own favored laws.  The 5th century critic who gets the most attention is Socrates.  In some ways, he can be seen as an "ameliorative" critic of democracy who wants to help it live up to its own ideals, rather than a "rejectionist" critic who thinks that the entire intellectual structure of democracy should be jettisoned.  Indeed, by acting as a gadfly who intended to improve democratic Athens, and by insisting that Athens was not living up to its own laws by prosecuting the generals of Arginusae affair, he "exemplifies democratic ideals better than all living democrats.  To this extent his life and thought constitute a criticism of democrats, but an ameliorative one" (p.120).  However, by the end of the chapter, Socrates ends up looking like an essentially misguided rejectionist.  While Socrates thinks democracy rests on relativism, Balot shows that democrats argued for their system using objective moral claims.  While Socrates insists that no amount of talk among non-experts could yield wisdom, Balot has already devoted considerable space in the previous chapter to show that public deliberation was an instrument for improving rationality.  And, finally, while Socrates dismisses democratic characters and education as hopelessly vicious, Balot turns the tables and accuses Socrates himself of having a faulty character:  he failed to join the democratic resistance to the oligarchic rule of 30, and he willingly fought in an army that helped Athens carry out its imperialistic ambitions.

The 4th century critics of Chapter Six pose a more serious challenge because they were more successful in articulating a plausible substitute for democratic justice.  In general, these critics insisted that any flourishing city must tightly join its ethics to its politics, and that a city focused on constitutional procedures at the expense of ethical development was doomed.  In order to illustrate an ineffective way of mounting such criticism, Balot briefly outlines the "republican nostalgia" (p.184) of Isocrates and Xenophon who plumped in a rather heavy-handed way for a virtuous aristocratic elite or super-virtuous monarch that could (implausibly) rid Greece of all its problems.  The far more formidable critic is Plato, since he took it upon himself to develop an entirely new conception of justice.  Balot's Plato never, at any point in his career, liked democracy. From the Gorgias, through the Republic, all the way to the Statesman and Laws, Plato insists that political decisions should be reserved for totally virtuous experts, and he never drops the idea that people should be ranked and valued to different degrees.  Nevertheless, though Plato's hostility to democracy remains fixed, Balot outlines several important changes that take place over the progression of his works.  First, law goes from being little more than psychological order, to designating social principles that reflect important theological realities.  Second, Plato is increasing ready to show respect for people who are not perfectly virtuous.  Though they'll never rule, people with some degree of, or potential for, virtue deserve citizen status as well as justifications for the laws they must follow.  Finally, Balot detects an increasing level of realism in Plato's writings, especially when it comes to the possibility for corruption among rulers.

The book ends with one chapter on Aristotle and then another on the Hellenistic philosophers.  Aristotle comes off particularly well: his method of using both empirical observation and normative argument looks suspiciously like the very method Balot would recommend to his readers; Balot uses Nussbaum's "thick but vague" characterization of Aristotle's ethical philosophy to show how such a conception of the good can promote a rich civic unity that avoids "claustrophobic communitarianism" (p. 301); Aristotle naturalizes politics without making the city an organism, and his commitment to empirical observation allows him to make great advances in the understanding of non-ideal states.  While Aristotle is described as someone who continues the themes of realism and virtuous citizenship of late-Plato, the Hellenistics are shown developing the "natural law" strains of their predecessors.  Their brand of political thought culminates in a description of a supremely rational and virtuous prince who is an instantiation of the divine.  There is some time spent on Epicureans and Cynics who develop anti-teleological, social contract theories that stress individualism; but Balot is much more interested in the tendency of Hellenistic thinkers to draw on previous ideas of political virtue, and he is unabashedly skeptical of interpretations that describe political thought after the death of Alexander as being completely divorced from the past due to transformed political realities.


Overall, I think this book is a success, and I will certainly recommend it to my own undergraduate and graduate students.  Moreover, I found it hard to put down and helpful for my own thinking about the aims and demands of "virtue politics."  My criticisms are little more than suggestions for ways Balot could more perfectly meet the goals he already largely succeeds in attaining.

First let me address one minor problem that arises when considering how well this book serves as an introduction for students.  Obviously, a major difficulty in producing any work in the "introduction to X" genre is that one is trying to produce an interesting, lively, but yet credible interpretation on a macro-scale without getting bogged down by scholarly micro-problems.  It would be inappropriate to blame Balot for taking sides in this or that scholarly debate with little or no discussion.  My criticism, however, is that there are times when Balot's effort to make this material relevant at the macro-level ends up actually hollowing out deep and important tensions that would be even more interesting to students.

The most salient example of this shortcoming occurs in Chapter Five, on imperialism.  Clearly Balot thinks ancient criticisms of Athenian imperialism are relevant today, since we are told that it is "eerily fascinating" (p. 167) to compare Athens and modern America.  The reader is exposed to a few of the pro-imperialistic positions taken by Isocrates and Xenophon, shown how they are palpably inadequate, and then introduced to a number of different theories that explain how such greedy selfishness could befall the citizens of a city.  At no point does imperialism seem plausible or even tempting, and the reader naturally wonders about the content of the imperialistic endoxa that compelled so many ancient democrats for such a long time.  Balot never really exposes what these could be.  Instead, Balot takes imperialism to be so unequivocally self-serving that he won't even call arguments for imperialism "arguments" at all; rather, he refers to them as "self-justifications."  I am sure that most readers, like myself, will sympathize with Balot's critical attitude.  But there is a real danger that Balot here risks turning one of the most disturbing and interesting historical problems of the ancient world into a rather dull morality play.  Why should rational people in general, and bright students in particular, spend much time thinking about such lame, transparent selfishness which lacks any rational justification?  The Marxist interpretation, from which Balot distances himself at the beginning of the chapter, strikes me as far more interesting: for in whatever ways Marxism is an unreliable guide for interpreting ancient politics, it at least makes imperialism intellectually intriguing by suggesting that it is a symptom of deeper structures and systems.

As for the second main goal of teaching students to use a method that is both historical and philosophical, I'm afraid I never became clear on how this method works and how it is to be applied.  Because Balot never explicitly lays out the principles of his method, and does not regularly contrast its conclusions with those which we would reach by using other approaches, the reader, and surely students, will feel a bit confused.  It seems to me that Balot's book exhibits a pattern that gives philosophy the lead role in producing positive theories, and then asks history to play a negative role of chastening philosophical theories that have become too far removed.  Take, for example, Balot's critique of Hanna Arendt's conception of democratic courage.  After describing Arendt's idea that political courage prompted each democratic citizen to escape the confines of the household and create "a memorial to himself," Balot asserts that her account is an attempt to make modern political life quasi-heroic, and then continues this way: "This heroically laden description, however, does little to advance our understanding of ancient democratic politics, which centered on the thoughts and behavior, perhaps sometimes heroic, of the citizenry as a collective unit… . Ancient democracy's contribution to our own (self-) understanding is greater, no less, if we get our historical interpretations straight" (p. 69).  For what it is worth, I do not agree with either Arendt's or Balot's historical interpretation on this issue.  But the real problem here is that it is very hard to predict when and how Balot will use this sort of "historical interpretation" to carry out a particular phase of his project.  At the beginning of Chapter Five, Balot insists that understanding ancient imperialism requires analysis grounded in history, but then he frames the entire discussion in Aristotle's normative theory of tyranny.  Before he discusses Platonic political thought, Balot reminds readers that they must "approach ancient texts from both a historical and normative standpoint," but he then goes on to say that "… Plato was an exceptionally imaginative figure.  He thought himself out of his local circumstances to an extent unthinkable for most writers.  Therefore, it makes sense to approach his work largely from the philosophical and normative perspective, so as to avoid unacceptably 'flattening' it out" (p.188).  Such readiness to abandon method in the face of tough cases makes it seem that there really isn't a method at all; rather, there is a (surely laudable) commitment to making history one among many interpretive options, with no promise to use it in any consistent way.

Finally, let me conclude by briefly discussing Balot's goal of showing scholars how ancient politics can become relevant by being framed in terms of virtue politics.  Balot makes it no secret that he thinks virtue-centric democratic theory provides a "genuine viam tertiam" (p.62) that combines elements from both liberal and communitarian political philosophies.  In his Epilogue, it becomes particularly clear that this third way would be a broadly wellfarist "social democracy" (p.301) shorn of ancient prejudices and paternalism, which, by stressing civic virtue and sympathetic participation, would avoid the "impersonal" and even "agoraphobic" character of modern America, and yet also be committed to some sort of cosmopolitanism.

Since the liberal and communitarian debates of the 80's have died down, there has been much written on "citizenship theory" and "civic republicanism."  Much of this writing is extremely interested in how societies can produce private citizens who are nevertheless motivated to promote civic ideals of justice, equality, and freedom.  Balot is quite clearly placing himself in this line of thought; his fundamental idea that the promotion of justice requires citizens who frequently exercise virtue is an almost perfect fit for the literature.  Unfortunately, Balot never develops this idea in a way that would show how it escapes the problem that all such attempts seem to face: namely, who will it satisfy?  Liberals of all stripes, from egalitarians like Rawls to libertarians like Nozick, insist that nothing in their (merely) political theories prevents citizens from forming ethically rich, socially meaningful, and personally gratifying associations on their own.  Meanwhile, communitarians of all stripes insist that it is structurally impossible to promote political life at a national or cosmopolitan level that doesn't alienate citizens who live their lives on a local level in accordance with very specific shared goods.  I am extremely sympathetic with Balot's ideal of meaningful political engagement, but we need more explanation of how ancient democratic theory will impress where other citizenship theories have underwhelmed.

None of these criticisms are meant to suggest that Balot fails to meet the three basic goals of his book.  On the contrary, the single theme that unites this evaluation is that Balot only needs to develop, and be more consistently committed to, the general framework that already outlines this inspired display of erudition on a wide range of topics.  Greek Political Thought is a helpful book and it is a great starting point for any student interested in the ethical and political thought of the ancient world.