Greek Tragedy and Political Philosophy

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Peter J. Ahrensdorf, Greek Tragedy and Political Philosophy, Cambridge UP, 2009, 192pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521515863.

Reviewed by Edith Hall, Royal Holloway University of London



This new study of the relationship between religious and political thought in Sophocles consists of three substantial chapters analysing the ‘Theban plays’, Oedipus Tyrannus, Oedipus at Colonus and Antigone respectively, framed by an Introduction and Conclusion. Ahrensdorf opens his study with the claim that, since the Enlightenment, political theory has tended to sideline the issue of religion. One way of countering this is to consider pre-modern thought about the relationship between religion and political enlightenment. Sophoclean tragedies, and in particular the ‘Theban plays’, offer a promising arena in which to conduct such an analysis.

Ahrensdorf nails his colours to the mast at the beginning of the book: Sophoclean drama, in his view, is both deeply respectful of the power of religion and at the same time politically rationalist. In the Sophoclean world it is, basically, possible to be both respectful of divinity and a rational political agent. According to Ahrensdorf, Nietzsche was therefore quite mistaken in seeing in the Greek tragic hero (and especially in Oedipus) a figure of huge grandeur who only achieves his nobility and wisdom through accepting the utter chaos, mystery, and cruelty of the world, along with the human inability to comprehend the metaphysical forces which govern it. Ahrensdorf argues in his Introduction that the Nietzsche’s reading has been predominant ever since the early 20th century, with scholars as diverse as Heidegger, Harold Bloom, Peter Euben and Arlene Saxonhouse acquiescing in Nietzsche’s insistence on the anti-rationalism of the Sophoclean tragic hero. He identifies his own position as one that differs from what (he claims) is this post-Nietzschean scholarly consensus. His Sophocles is in fact not a critic of rationalism, but advocates, rather, a ‘humane rationalism’. Its vehicle is a model of statesmanship that follows a middle way. It involves neither an extreme rationalism that excludes a religious perspective, nor an extreme anti-rationalism that excludes the power of reasoned argument and self-questioning. A good leader will do a great deal of Socratic inductive reasoning, but leave a substantial place for acknowledging the power of the divine and the unknowable in human life.

In the three detailed studies of the individual Theban plays which follow, Ahrensdorf adopts a method of close textual analysis, working through each play’s presentation of the relative importance of human-centred ratiocination and god-focussed metaphysical intuition. In Oedipus the Tyrant, Oedipus is an enlightened, scientific leader, whose leadership of Thebes promises to liberate the city from superstition and replace it with the rule of reason. His downfall is caused ‘not by his dedication to reason, but by his abandonment of reason and his turn to piety’ (p. 7). In Oedipus at Colonus, Sophocles argues that the elderly Oedipus’ religious anti-rationalism is actually self-contradictory and self-destructive, since it causes terrible suffering to his children. In Antigone, the heroine is the character who, although acting in the name of a religious imperative, nevertheless comes to genuinely wrestle, in her eventual self-doubt, with the philosophical issues of ethics and justice. Creon, meanwhile, fails to act in accordance with the spirit of the sensible decision he (eventually) makes to release Antigone. This is because he puts piety first in attending to the corpse of Polynices before attending to the living girl, and thus causes damage through excessive piety. (I found this last stage in the argument particularly hard to swallow.)

The book is very carefully written, densely argued, and clearly the result of a very great deal of sustained thought. I fundamentally agree, moreover, with Ahrensdorf’s overall characterisation of Sophoclean thought, even if some of his detailed interpretations seem perverse. Along with many other classicists including Victor Ehrenberg, Pat Easterling, Martha Nussbaum, Jon Hesk and Simon Goldhill, I have stressed Sophocles’ interest in deliberative thinking and his plays’ tendency to show how interested he is in the importance of ratiocination in civic leaders, and how, in his plays, precipitate decision-taking leads directly to tragic outcomes. My first concern, therefore, is that I do not recognise the adversary which Ahrensdorf sets up. He is arguing against an opponent who claims Sophocles is a pietistic enemy of rationalism. There are some scholars who still write that some parts of some Sophoclean plays explore the terror that humans face on account of the limits of their understanding of their situation. But amongst scholars writing since the 1970s, at any rate, I just don’t recognise Ahrensdorf’s notional hyper-Nietzschean adversary.

My more serious concern, however, has to do with his method. Ahrensdorf seems not entirely at ease with handling dramatic literature, which is curious given that in his first book, The Death of Socrates and the Life of Philosophy: An Interpretation of Plato’s Phaedo (1995), he explored the way in which Platonic dialogue functions dramatically to spur on the reader to think for herself and respond with counter-arguments. Yet when it comes to Oedipus the Tyrant, we hear that ‘the play as a whole seems to point to the conclusion either that the gods are whimsical and cruel or that they do not exist’ (p. 20), whereas in fact different characters articulate wholly different perspectives on the developing events, and the play ‘as a whole’ does not have a philosophical conclusion: it enacts a variety of radically different responses and actions by the different parties involved. Drama simply can’t be read in the same way as a treatise by Nietzsche, or Heidegger, or for that matter Harold Bloom. Ahrensdorf’s response to dramatic form is very simplistic: he identifies a single character in each play who seems to him to be the mouthpiece of Sophocles. In Oedipus Tyrannus it is the Second Messenger that ‘is the character who comes closest to speaking for the poet in the play’. In Oedipus at Colonus it is Theseus who ‘reminds us of no one more than the poet Sophocles himself’ (p. 77). But the inadequacy of this method in dealing with a multi-vocal text (which explores the vast range and nuance of responses to the world in the human consciousness in a diverse set of aesthetic, musical, metrical and performative modes including lyric aria and choral procession) is revealed most acutely in the closing paragraph on Oedipus the Tyrant. For Ahrensdorf, ‘what is Sophocles’ play if not a written speech about the deeds of Oedipus, noble and ignoble, and a timeless invitation to reflect on those deeds and on his fate’ (p. 47). Well, the text may have proved timeless and may indeed ask us to reflect on what happened to Oedipus. But it is not and never was ‘a written speech’ by Sophocles. It is a dense and intense set of dramatised encounters, most of them adversarial confrontations, between fictional individuals and a community, designed to be experienced in live performance by another, historically specific community with its own interpretive agenda.

Indeed, one of the frustrations of Ahrensdorf’s method is that it takes almost all the historical particularity out of the plays, as if political arguments can stand entirely aloof from history. In choosing to discuss the plays about the Theban royal family, for example, Ahrensdorf is entering a world where the Athenian democratic tragedians are talking about the prehistory of an oligarchic community, less than two days’ walk away, which was amongst their deadliest enemies. The question of whether Athens will or will not welcome the elderly Oedipus tells us a good deal more about the need of Sophocles’ contemporaries to manipulate the mythical past in the service of contemporary interests than about a disembodied and decontextualised phenomenon called ‘classical political thought’. Some outstanding classicists, especially Froma Zeitlin, have demonstrated what the Athenian playwrights did with Thebes in excellent publications of which Ahrensdorf takes too little notice.

The other problem is that in asking us to consider how Sophoclean drama adumbrates Socratic political reasoning, the intellectual context in which Socrates and Sophocles both flourished is bypassed altogether. Some of the best work done on Sophoclean political thought, from the 19th century onwards, emphasises the close resemblances between the worldview expressed by some of his characters and that of the sophist Protagoras, who scarcely makes it into the book (in its third footnote from the last). His treatise on the gods included the famous assertions that ‘man is the measure of all things’, and that the existence of gods is an assumption that cannot be verified (Protagoras fragments 1 and 4 Diels Kranz). Protagoras was also responsible for a model of society in which reason in the form of technological progress leads by degrees from the cave to the city-state. But ancient Greek thought accommodated simultaneously the ‘lapsarian’ myth of the fall of the human race from a blissful utopian golden age, articulated in Hesiod’s Works and Days 109-26, and the idea of the ineluctable technological progress that had allowed humans to advance. Humanity was on the rise or in decline depending on your point of view. Tragedy generally has an upbeat view of human progress, preferring the Protagorean to the Hesiodic view of the past, but with the proviso, emphasised by the many characters including the chorus of Antigone, that it is crucial to practise caution and all due respect for the gods and traditional ways of propitiating them while human progress continues. The tension between the human intelligence on which the Athenian democracy prided itself and the traditional religious outlook undeniably underpins all Greek tragedy in subtle but fundamental ways. As Albert Camus suggested in a famous lecture, tragedy as a genre becomes prominent in a community that is half-way between a sacred society and a society built by man; effective tragedy is created by crystallising the tensions between these viewpoints.1

Ahrensdorf’s need to emphasise the admirably rational in Sophocles means that he must play down the theatrical power of his theatre, in particular the often spine-tingling impact of the representation of the super- (or supra-) natural. This is most apparent in his discussion of the last exit of Oedipus in Oedipus at Colonus, a thrilling moment in which the hero is suddenly transformed and the audience is given a sense of the awesome, supernatural power at work in preparing him for his heroic status after death. He can powerfully sense the presence of divinity — of Hermes, the god who escorted the dying to the Underworld, and Persephone, its Queen. The feeble, blind old man, who has leant physically on others throughout the play, can suddenly now walk without difficulty, and alone, perfectly certain of the route he must take to his destination (1540-8).

I do have other quibbles. Confidence is not inspired by the absence of accents and breathing marks in quotations from ancient Greek. I was also taken by surprise by some peculiar questions such as whether the chorus of Oedipus at Colonus is correct in being persuaded that a man who has committed parricide and incest deserves the divine reward of everlasting well-being (p. 38). This rather misses the fundamentally dialectical mode of ancient Greek mythical thought, in which opposites are united rather than mutually exclusive. Seers are blind, Goddesses of Blessings are also in charge of Curses, Apollo’s bow can bring death or healing, and Oedipus was a cult hero in charge of punishing precisely the crimes against the family such as incest and kin-killing that he had himself committed. Yet these are the reactions of a scholar trained in cultural (which includes cultic) history of ancient Greece, and in the contextualisation of ancient Greek theatre texts within the social and linguistic structures that produced them. Ahrensdorf, a political philosopher, gathers Socrates, Nietzsche, and Heidegger, around a table in his virtual department of political theory in order to retrieve Sophoclean drama for the world of reason. I would invite rather different figures to the discussion (including Protagoras, Thucydides and Hegel as well as some theatre directors) and emphasise the exceptional complexity of Sophocles’ portrayal, through enacted dialogue, of the dialectic between deliberation and intuition in human responses to an often baffling universe. Yet it is ultimately gratifying to find a political philosopher addressing this great dramatist with such energy and conviction, however much I may sometimes question the suitability of his analytical toolkit.

1 Albert Camus, ’L’Avenir de la tragedie’ (1955), translated as ‘On the Future of Tragedy in Philip Thody (ed.) Lyrical and Critical Essays (New York, 1969) 301.