Griffin on Human Rights

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Roger Crisp (ed.), Griffin on Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2014, 237pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199668731.

Reviewed by Christine Straehle, University of Ottawa


One of the possible merits of an edited collection of essays discussing an earlier work is that, if done well, it can provide an excellent introduction to different aspects of the volume under consideration while also reflecting the state of the debate. This is such a book. The contributors are all deeply engaged with James Griffin's On Human Rights[1], while also providing some of their own views on the moral foundations of human rights. And although Griffin wonders in his reply at the end of the book how some of the commentators may have "managed to so misunderstand" him (211), each contributor raises important concerns with Griffin's account, motivated by the aim to provide a plausible, defensible and, ultimately, ethics-relevant account of the foundations of human rights.

One way to disagree about such a theory is methodological. Should we adopt basic principles as the starting point of our thinking about human rights? Roger Crisp proposes that, to some extent, Griffin adopts such an a priori approach since he adopts a concept of human dignity that is akin to Kant's, stipulating that something is due to individuals as humans simpliciter. Griffin argues that the protections of human rights are owed to individuals as humans, which leads Crisp to argue that Griffin's theory is at least in part Kantian. Griffin, however, denies this. The important distinction to Kant's ethics is that in his account practicalities serve as determinants of moral imperatives, whereas Kant excludes such consideration in his account of what we owe to others (222). The practicalities Griffin has in mind are the limits to human motivation and human cognition.

Griffin aims to achieve two goals -- to address the latent indeterminacy of the moral foundations of human rights in ethical discourse and to insert himself into the debate about the use of the term 'human right' such as it is proposed by "philosophers, political theorists, international lawyers, jurisprudents, civil servants, politicians, and human rights activists" (225). Hence, a bottom-up approach of defining the moral content of human rights has to be adopted. It is supposed to allow for both analytical rigour when defining moral human rights while also allowing for the theory to have practical clout. Griffin explains that his account of the moral foundations of human rights "have their ground in three values of personhood: autonomy, liberty and minimum provision" (Griffin, 2008: 51). The resulting list of human rights, then, is far more restricted than those with common currency.

Carl Wellman wonders how bottom-up an approach is that suggests and stipulates personhood as the moral reference point, along which to define what should count as a human right. Why should we agree on the account of personhood and this one in particular, to accept as the moral foundation of human rights?

A similar concern is raised by other contributors who wonder why we should privilege normative agency as: i) the characteristic that distinguishes rights bearers from non-right-bearers (Rowan Cruft and Crisp); ii) as the criterion of personhood (David Miller); or finally, (iii) as the criterion of a good life (Miller). David Reidy, Cruft and Crisp in particular worry that by focusing on the capacity for normative agency, some of those who may be most in need of protection of their dignity -- the severely mentally handicapped or very young children, for instance -- may be denied the protection that human rights are meant to provide. Reidy asks why we should adopt such a 'threshold' conception of human rights that risks excluding some (59), while Cruft suggests a friendly amendment to expand Griffin's view.

Griffin's answer to these concerns is two-fold. First, he argues that those singling out normative agency as the criterion of personhood neglect the other two parts of his personhood account, which, from his perspective, are equally important when determining what kind of provisions should be protected by human rights. Second, he argues that his personhood account is not meant to ground human rights that enable "a flourishing life" but instead the "more austere life of normative agency" (213). In fact, he argues that to realize normative agency does not depend on achieving one's goals (224), but to be "able to form and implement a conception of a worthwhile life" (213). We may wonder about this response. Surely we can agree on the value of normative agency as a value for individuals because it helps us achieve something worthwhile -- but why assume that a life worthwhile living, however defined, is not also a flourishing life?[2]

By way of this reply, though, we can see how some of Griffin's commentators may have taken normative agency as the most important part of the personhood account. In other words, it is not quite clear how the liberty provision and the minimum provision ought to function otherwise than as enabling conditions of normative agency. Assume that we accept that the liberty provision were independently as important as the normative agency condition in Griffin's account of personhood. We could then assume, further, that Griffin would endorse some of the current liberty rights as human rights. However, as James Nickel explains in his contribution, this is not the case. Nickel discusses some of the most important liberty provisions we often assume to be protected by human rights, such as the right to residency and democratic rights, neither of which Griffin wants to accept as sufficiently personhood relevant to warrant human right status. In fact, according to Nickel, Griffin argues that liberty is not constitutive of individual well-being and that it is only relevant insofar as it allows and fosters normative agency (193). And while Griffin tries to refute this interpretation in his reply, it is nevertheless the case that in his original description of the link between normative agency, the liberty and minimum provision, liberty is given an auxiliary role. As I already mentioned, agency is characterized as being able to form and implement a conception of a worthwhile life, and "we must be free to pursue that conception. I have been calling this 'liberty'" (231).

Let's turn to the minimum provision. Both Miller and Allen Buchanan address this part of Griffin's account. Miller has proposed his own account of the moral basis of human rights as basic human needs.[3] According to Miller, a needs-based account of human rights has at least two clear advantages over Griffin's personhood account. A needs-based account of human rights would help promote the universal character of the protections human rights aim to provide, since basic needs are universally recognized. In contrast, the specific kind of personhood account Griffin proposes as the moral foundation of human rights has strong liberal western overtones. Griffin denies this with reference to the practicalities condition already mentioned, and which he thinks assures universality of his account. I will return to this point later on.

Second, according to Miller, a needs-based account identifies the political nature of human rights claims -- we invoke human rights against states, and not against each other. Griffin seems to agree. A needs-based foundation of human rights would yield four sets of rights -- material, freedom, social rights and protection rights (161) -- that would allow for the kind of political claims for minimal provision that Miller assumes both he and Griffin would want to morally ground. Instead, the worry here seems to be that Griffin's minimum provision criterion of personhood is not sufficiently demanding to be used as the basis of concrete political claims, once again lending support to the view that the most important aspect of Griffin's personhood account is in fact normative agency.

Recall here that Griffin's account is motivated by a concern for human dignity, which according to Crisp can be defined with Kant as "an absolute inner worth by which he exacts respect for himself" (105). We may imagine that much of what the minimal provision has to achieve in a given societal context can be derived from reference to dignity as an interpersonal good. However, according to Buchanan, Griffin's account neglects the social-comparative aspect of human dignity as equal status in a societal context (105). Buchanan argues that a theory of human rights needs to include a concept of the good and a concept of right. More specifically, it needs to define the conditions of a minimally good life, as well as the principles that help us respect and achieve equal status (110). In his reply to Buchanan, Reidy and John Tasioulas, Griffin argues against equality as an independent value, but as a "state in the world" that only becomes relevant for ethical consideration "by having the right sort of connection to something else that is substantively valuable" (217). The value he proposes to employ is that of normative agency.

I believe what is relevant here -- albeit potentially problematic -- is that Griffin's account tries to provide for both the moral foundations for political claims as well as a principle based on which interpersonal relations can be assessed. According to Griffin, "[a] human right is a claim of all human agents against all other human agents" (Griffin 2008: 177). We may, with Crisp, worry about this expansive use of human rights, since herein may lie a trap of further indeterminacy. In expanding the realm of human rights claims to interpersonal relations, however, we may say that Griffin inserts the social-comparative aspect of dignity in his account of personhood that Buchanan finds lacking.

Brad Hooker's chapter is helpful here in explaining Griffin's teleology. According to Hooker, Griffin could answer Buchanan that his teleological account of pursuing the good "comprised of normative agency and other values (such as welfare)" (180) addresses Buchanan's concern that a moral theory of human rights ought to provide for a concept of the good as well as a concept of right (110). The theory of right in Griffin consists in "all moral requirements, some of which come from other people's human rights" (180). Put differently, the conditions of normative agency take into account equal status within society.

Buchanan's contribution echoes a further question about the objectives of human rights originally raised by Tasioulas and Reidy. As I mentioned, all three raise equality as a value worth protecting through human rights, while Griffin denies equality the moral properties they ascribe it. To Griffin, the aim of human rights is to protect individual personhood in its triadic formulation of normative agency, liberty and minimum provision. However, Tasioulas and Reidy ask why only moral rights should find protection, and why political rights are excluded from the realm of human rights (16). Reidy formulates this concern well when asking what is specific about rights, as rights that should warrant this (63). Tasioulas calls for a pluralist account of human rights, especially if Griffin wants to assure, as he suggests in his response to Miller, that the kind of determinate human rights he defends can claim universality (26). Both Reidy and Tasioulas agree that such a universal claim requires a pluralist account beyond personhood as the foundation of human rights. Here, again, Hooker's interpretation of the role of practicalities helps us understand Griffin's conceptual background: since practicalities are not tied to particular places or periods of time (see Griffin 2008: 38), the limits that practicalities impose on our thinking about human rights are meant to assure universalizability of the human rights as they are morally grounded in the value of individual personhood.

Much more could be said about this important volume and its merits, both as a discussion of Griffin's work in particular and as a general commentary on some of the most pressing issues in the philosophy of human rights today.

[1] Reviewed in NDPR by William J. Talbott.

[2] In his review, Talbott argues that Griffin's account of the uses of normative agency can be linked to Martha Nussbaum's list of capabilities any account of human rights should aim to protect. The distinction Griffin hopes to make between worthwhile and flourishing life can help explain why Griffin seemingly neglects Nussbaum's account. 

[3] David Miller, National Responsibility and Global Justice, Oxford University Press, 2007; "Grounding Human Rights," Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy, 15: 407-427 (2012).