Grounding Concepts: An Empirical Basis for Arithmetical Knowledge

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C. S. Jenkins, Grounding Concepts: An Empirical Basis for Arithmetical Knowledge, Oxford UP, 2008, 290pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199231577.

Reviewed by Joshua Schechter, Brown University




Grounding Concepts by Carrie Jenkins is an ambitious work in the epistemology of arithmetic. It should be of interest to anyone working in the philosophy of mathematics or on the nature of the a priori more generally. The aim of the book is to sketch an account of our knowledge of simple arithmetical truths that is compatible with three theses. First, arithmetical realism is correct in that the truths of arithmetic obtain independently of our minds. Second, arithmetic is an a priori discipline in the sense that arithmetical truths can be known without reliance on empirical evidence. Third, empiricism is correct in the sense that all knowledge of the mind-independent world ultimately rests upon sense experience. Jenkins’ central idea is that experience does not play an evidential role in supporting our arithmetical beliefs but instead plays a very different kind of epistemic role. On her view, simple arithmetical truths are conceptual truths — they can be known on the basis of examining our arithmetical concepts. Yet the competent examination of concepts does not always yield knowledge. For a competent conceptual examination to yield knowledge, the relevant concepts must be epistemically privileged — what Jenkins calls “grounded”. The role of experience, then, is not to provide evidence for our arithmetical beliefs but to ground our arithmetical concepts.

I think highly of this book. Grounding Concepts adds a genuinely new option to the philosophical landscape. The central idea - that sense experience may be relevant to the epistemic status of concepts and thus play a non-evidential role in explaining knowledge - is both sensible and clever. The book is sophisticated and accessible, both extremely careful and extremely clear.

Grounding Concepts primarily focuses on the big picture. This is both a strength and a weakness of the work. It is a strength in that the book is able to avoid distracting technicalities. It is also able to remain neutral on many puzzling issues in the philosophy of mathematics. This helps to make the general structure of the proposal clear. On the other hand, the high level of abstraction makes it difficult to evaluate how promising the book’s strategy for explaining our arithmetical knowledge really is.

Grounding Concepts is divided into three parts, each three chapters long. The first part lays the groundwork for the proposed account of arithmetical knowledge. In the first chapter, Jenkins provides a sophisticated discussion of various construals of realism and argues that realism is best understood in terms of essence rather than necessity. In the second chapter, Jenkins discusses contemporary accounts of a priori knowledge. In particular, she considers and rejects the views of Boghossian, Peacocke, Bealer, and Field. This discussion provides a helpful addition to the literature on these views. The third chapter proposes a novel externalist account of knowledge. In rough outline, the idea is that a thinker knows that p just in case the thinker’s belief that p can be well explained to an outsider — someone unaware of the details of the thinker’s situation — just by citing the fact that p.

The second part of the book presents and develops the account of our knowledge of simple arithmetical truths. The majority of chapter four concerns the nature of concepts and conceptual truth. On Jenkins’ view, a concept counts as grounded if it non-accidentally represents some feature of reality. Grounded concepts yield conceptual truths: any belief arrived at via the competent conceptual examination of grounded concepts counts as knowledge. The remainder of chapter four and chapter five apply this account to the particular case of arithmetic. Our arithmetical concepts, such as the concepts 7, , 5, =, and 12, are grounded by sense experience. Simple arithmetical truths, such as the truth that 75=12, are believed on the basis of competent examination of our arithmetical concepts. This explains how we have a priori knowledge of such truths. Chapter six considers related philosophical projects and distinguishes Jenkins’ approach from these alternatives.

The third part of the book discusses several objections to the account of concept grounding and the account of arithmetical knowledge.

The main positive contributions of Grounding Concepts come in chapters three through five, with the presentation of a novel externalist theory of knowledge, an account of conceptual truth, and a theory of our knowledge of simple arithmetical truths. It is worth discussing each of these three proposals in greater detail.

Theory of Knowledge

Jenkins’ account of knowledge is put forward as a plausible externalist theory that does not immediately rule out the possibility of a priori knowledge of mind-independent truths (unlike, for instance, some versions of the causal theory of knowledge). The account is also advertised as immune to Gettier counterexamples.

Jenkins’ account is explanationist. The rough idea is that S knows that p just in case S believes that p, p is true, the fact that p explains S’s belief that p, and the explanatory connection is of the right sort — that is, it is “normal”. (The view is thus related to the accounts of Alan Goldman and Steven Rieber.) The novel part of Jenkins’ account is her treatment of normal explanatory connections. Here, Jenkins appeals to the idea of an outsider — a rational thinker who is aware of commonplace facts about persons and their mental lives but is not aware of special facts about S or S’s particular situation. The idea is that in the case of a normal connection, there is nothing unusual about the situation that would need to be mentioned to an outsider in the course of an explanation of S’s belief that p. It would not be misleading to leave out the details and simply cite the fact that p. On Jenkins’ view, then, S knows that p just in case citing p would provide an outsider with a good explanation of S’s belief that p.

In thinking about this part of the book, one may wonder why Jenkins’ discussion is so heavily focused on knowledge, and in particular, on Gettier cases. It seems to me that the central puzzles in the epistemology of arithmetic do not directly concern knowledge. One puzzle is to explain how it is that our beliefs about arithmetic are true given that the truths of arithmetic are independent of us. This is a form of the Benacerraf-Field problem for arithmetical Platonism. A second puzzle is to explain how it is that we are justified — or to use Jenkins’ phrase, “rationally respectable” — in holding our arithmetical beliefs. The explanation of our arithmetical knowledge per se seems far less pressing. While there are plausible examples of Gettier cases for arithmetic, such cases seem relatively marginal.

Be that as it may, it is worthwhile to consider the plausibility of Jenkins’ account as a general account of knowledge. As advertised, the account is better suited to explain the possibility of a priori knowledge than the causal theory. However, Jenkins’ account seems to have many of the same counterexamples as more familiar externalist theories. For example, consider a version of Ginet’s Fake Barn Country scenario:

Suppose that, unbeknownst to him, Henry is in an area in which the majority of structures that look like barns are mere barn facades. Suppose that Henry sees a genuine barn from a distance and thereby comes to believe that he is standing in front of a barn.1

Intuitively, Henry does not know that he is standing in front of a barn. However, Jenkins’ account seems to deliver the wrong result. It would not be misleading to tell the outsider that Henry believes that he is in front of a barn because he is in front of a barn. The fact that he is in Fake Barn Country is irrelevant to the explanation of Henry’s belief.

This scenario provides an apparent counterexample to the sufficiency of Jenkins’ account. There are also apparent counterexamples to its necessity. Consider, for instance, a case of overdetermination:

Suppose that Edgar knows that Allan has taken a fatal dose of poison and that enough time has passed that Allan must be dead. In fact, Allan is dead. However, unbeknownst to Edgar, Allan died because he ran into the street after taking the poison and was promptly run over by a bus.2

Intuitively, Edgar knows that Allan is dead. But presumably Edgar’s belief that Allan is dead would not be well explained to an outsider simply by citing the fact that Allan is dead. This would be a misleading explanation; it would mislead the outsider into thinking that Edgar had a correct belief as to the cause of Allan’s death.

To handle these apparent counterexamples, Jenkins might appeal to a distinction she draws between two kinds of unusual explanatory factors. She distinguishes unusual features of an explanatory connection from unusual kinds of explanatory connections. She further claims that unusual features do not need to be cited in an explanation to avoid misleading one’s audience, while unusual kinds of explanatory connections do. Making use of this distinction, Jenkins might argue that in the Fake Barn Country case, the failure of knowledge stems from the fact that there is an unusual kind of explanatory link, while in the Edgar-Allan case there is only an unusual feature of the explanatory link.

However, insofar as I understand Jenkins’ distinction, this diagnosis seems to get things the wrong way around. In the Fake Barn Country case, the relevant belief is based on veridical perception, an ordinary kind of explanatory link. It is the other features of the situation that are somewhat unusual. In the Edgar-Allan scenario, the explanatory link is what is unusual. So it is not obvious that Jenkins’ account can easily answer these apparent counterexamples.

Having raised these concerns, I should also highlight the fact that Jenkins’ discussion of knowledge makes a genuine contribution to the literature. The strategy of appealing to what can be left out of explanations is both novel and clever. It strikes me as a promising avenue to explore in approaching the problem of distinguishing between normal and non-normal explanatory chains — an issue that arises in many different areas of philosophy.

Concepts and Conceptual Truth

Let me now turn to Jenkins’ account of concepts and conceptual truth. On Jenkins’ view, just as beliefs have epistemic properties, so too do concepts. In particular, just as beliefs can count as true or false, justified or unjustified, or knowledge or non-knowledge, concepts can count as accurate or inaccurate, justified or unjustified, or grounded or ungrounded. Indeed, the corresponding properties of concepts and beliefs are closely analogous. A belief counts as knowledge just in case it is true and there is nothing accidental about its being true. Analogously, a concept counts as grounded just in case it is accurate and there is nothing accidental about its being accurate. (More precisely, by analogy with her account of knowledge, Jenkins claims that a thinker’s concept is grounded just in case the thinker’s possession of the concept can be well explained to an outsider just by citing the fact that the concept is accurate.)

The discussion of the epistemic properties of concepts is tied to the account of conceptual truth. According to Jenkins, there is a process of investigating or examining one’s concepts. The epistemic status of the beliefs resulting from this process depends on the epistemic status of the relevant concepts. In particular, the competent conceptual examination of accurate concepts yields true beliefs. The competent conceptual examination of justified concepts yields justified beliefs. The competent conceptual examination of grounded concepts yields knowledge — that is, conceptual truths.

This is an elegant account.

Jenkins makes an additional claim about concept grounding that is worth noting. She claims that concepts can only be grounded in ways that involve the senses. This is, in part, why her view ends up being a form of empiricism.

There are two issues that I would like to raise regarding this account. The first concerns the notion of concept grounding. I agree with Jenkins that there can be epistemically defective concepts that do not give rise to conceptual truths. (Prior’s example of tonk and Dummett’s example of boche are potential examples.) But it is less clear to me that there can be concepts that are defective in the same way that Gettiered beliefs are defective. For instance, suppose that someone is implanted with a new accurate concept by a benevolent neuroscientist. Do we really want to say that the thinker’s concept is defective in that its competent examination cannot yield knowledge? I do not find this obvious. In supporting Jenkins’ view, it would be helpful to have an intuitive case of a thinker who forms a justified true belief that is not knowledge on the basis of a competent conceptual examination of an ungrounded concept. That is to say, it would be helpful to have a clear example of a Gettier case for concepts.

The second issue concerns Jenkins’ empiricism. Jenkins claims that concepts can only be grounded on the basis of sense experience. But it is not obvious that this is correct given the rest of her views. Suppose that a thinker is hardwired to acquire and retain a given concept no matter what. Suppose that there is an evolutionary explanation of this fact: the thinker’s ancestors were selected for possessing this concept because it was advantageous to do so in their environment. Suppose, too, possessing the concept was advantageous because it accurately represents some important feature of reality. It seems to me that in such a case we should say that the concept is grounded. This is so despite the fact that its possession does not depend on sense experience.

Jenkins briefly discusses this issue and argues that such a concept should not count as grounded, since “epistemic sensitivity to the world is normally thought of as occurring at the level of individuals, not at the level of species” (p. 234). Thus, she argues, it would be misleading to tell an outsider that the thinker possesses the concept because it is accurate. I do not find this line of thought fully persuasive. An evolutionary explanation of the presence of some trait is an ordinary kind of explanation, one that should be unsurprising to an outsider. Moreover, since it is an open empirical possibility that some of our arithmetical or logical concepts are actually hardwired in this way, we should be open to the possibility that concepts can be grounded not on the basis of experience.

I don’t think, however, that this poses a problem for Jenkins’ account of concept grounding. Rather, I suspect that it is the empiricism that ought to be modified. Jenkins claims that we have a strong pre-theoretic intuition that empiricism is true. I don’t share that intuition. Empiricism seems to me to be a theoretical commitment that is primarily motivated by a commitment to naturalism. Since the existence of evolved hardwired concepts is compatible with a general naturalistic worldview, there seems little cost in rejecting a strictly empiricist view.

Jenkins’ account of concept grounding thus seems better suited to playing a role in the defense of a realist, a priori, and naturalist theory of arithmetical knowledge. Insofar as these three theses are independently plausible, this is a valuable contribution to make.

The Epistemology of Arithmetic

We’re now in a position to examine Jenkins’ account of our knowledge of arithmetic. On her view, our knowledge of simple arithmetical truths, such as our knowledge of the fact that 7+5=12, is explained as follows: The external world has arithmetical structure. Our sense experience — what Jenkins calls “”SpellE">unconceptualized sensory input" — is generated by our interaction with the world. This sensory input also has arithmetical structure that corresponds to the arithmetical structure of the world. The arithmetical structure of our experience is what grounds our arithmetical concepts. There are at least two possible ways in which our arithmetical concepts may be grounded. We may have acquired these concepts on the basis of our sensory input — “the camera-brain hypothesis”. Alternatively, these concepts may have been innately acquired but retained due to their usefulness when applied to sensory input — the “filter-brain hypothesis”. We form simple arithmetical beliefs, such as the belief that 7+5=12, on the basis of conducting competent investigations of our arithmetical concepts. Since our arithmetical concepts are grounded, these simple arithmetical beliefs count as knowledge.

This strikes me as a promising strategy for explaining our knowledge of arithmetic (and perhaps other a priori domains). But it is difficult to evaluate whether it ultimately can be made to work. One issue concerns the parts of arithmetic that go beyond simple equations. We don’t only want to explain how we know that 7+5=12. We also want to explain our knowledge of various generalizations — for instance, that every number has a successor, that addition is commutative, and that the principle of mathematical induction is true. For the proposed strategy to explain this general knowledge, our sensory input must have a rich arithmetical structure. (Or, alternatively, sensory input with a meager arithmetical structure must be able to ground sophisticated arithmetical concepts.) It would be helpful to have some indication of how this story might go.

Even for the case of 7+5=12, it would be useful to have a better sense of the details of the account. For instance, I’m not entirely sure what it is for the world to have arithmetical structure. Does it suffice that the world contain objects? I’m not sure what it is for our sensory input to have arithmetical structure. Presumably, the arithmetical structure of our sensory input is whatever it is that explains why arithmetical concepts are useful in organizing our experience. But it is not clear to me just what that comes to. I’m also not sure how the structure of our sensory input is supposed to ground even simple arithmetical concepts. In order to have a better sense of whether Jenkins’ account can explain our arithmetical knowledge, it would be helpful to have a toy model that shows how the details might be filled in.

A different issue with Jenkins’ account concerns whether it can really explain the a priori status of our arithmetical knowledge. Suppose (for simplicity) that the world had turned out to be Newtonian. Suppose that we possessed the Newtonian concepts of force, mass, and acceleration, and that these concepts were grounded by our sense experience. It is plausible that the competent examination of the Newtonian concepts will yield the belief that F=MA. On Jenkins’ view, then, this belief would count as a priori knowledge. Indeed, this scenario exactly parallels Jenkins’ account of our actual knowledge that 7+5=12. But this is intuitively wrong. Even in the described scenario, the belief that F=MA should count as a posteriori. At the very least, there is a significant intuitive difference between that piece of knowledge and our knowledge that 7+5=12. It is not clear whether the account has the resources to explain this difference.

Higher-Order Knowledge

Let me now turn to one last interesting issue that is discussed by Jenkins. This is the status of higher-order knowledge — for instance, the knowledge that certain beliefs count as justified or knowledge, and the knowledge that certain concepts count as justified or grounded.

How do we know that our arithmetical concepts are justified? In answering this question, Jenkins appeals to the indispensability of these concepts. Our arithmetical concepts are useful in categorizing, predicting, and explaining our experience. Indeed, our arithmetical concepts are indispensable to our best scientific theories of the world. This provides us with a posteriori evidence that our arithmetical concepts are justified. On the basis of this evidence, we can come to know that our arithmetical concepts are justified and (derivatively) that our simple arithmetical beliefs are justified.

While I see the intuitive pull of this view, it strikes me as a somewhat uncomfortable position to adopt. On Jenkins’ view, we are justified in believing simple arithmetical truths on the basis of examining our concepts, but we are justified in believing that we are so justified on the basis of investigating what is indispensable to our scientific theories of the world. This is an awkward juxtaposition of views.

That is Jenkins’ view on our knowledge of justification. What about our knowledge of knowledge? Jenkins suggests that we cannot have any such knowledge. We cannot know that we know arithmetical truths or that our arithmetical concepts are grounded. She writes,

All we can do in the case of belief is to say which of our beliefs we think are justified, and assume that most or all of these are knowledge. By the same token, all we can do in the case of concepts is say which of our concepts we think are justified, and assume that most or all of these are grounded. (p. 144)

Thus, Jenkins seems to endorse a skeptical view about knowledge of knowledge.

Presumably, the background thought here concerns truth and accuracy: We cannot “tell from the inside” that our arithmetical beliefs are true or that our arithmetical concepts accurately represent genuine features of reality. So we cannot know that our arithmetical beliefs count as knowledge or that our arithmetical concepts count as grounded.

This also strikes me as an uncomfortable position to adopt. Skepticism about higher-order knowledge is intuitively implausible; it seems intuitive that we know that we know that 7+5=12. Moreover, it is difficult to see how this position fits with the rest of Jenkins’ views. On Jenkins’ account, we can know that 7+5=12 on the basis of examining our arithmetical concepts. Presumably, we can know that we believe that 7+5=12 on the basis of introspection. So why can’t we put this knowledge together and come to know that our arithmetical belief is true? And if we can do that, and we can also come to know that our belief is justified, why can’t we know that we know that 7+5=12? It is difficult to see what additional bar there could be to our knowledge of our knowledge.


These critical remarks notwithstanding, Grounding Concepts is an excellent book. It provides a sophisticated and clear discussion of a difficult nest of issues in the philosophy of mathematics, epistemology, philosophy of mind, and metaphysics. By developing a new theoretical option, it makes a significant contribution to the literature on the epistemology of the a priori. Anyone interested in the epistemology of arithmetic or the nature of a priori knowledge would profit from reading it.3


Feldman, Richard. 2003. Epistemology. Upper Saddle River: Prentice Hall.

Goldman, Alvin. 1976. “Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge” The Journal of Philosophy, 73: 771-791.

1 See Goldman (1976: 773) for the introduction of this scenario.

2 This is a modified version of a case in Feldman (2003: 85).

3 Thanks to David Christensen for helpful comments on a draft of this review.