Groundless Existence: The Political Ontology of Carl Schmitt

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Michael Marder, Groundless Existence: The Political Ontology of Carl Schmitt, Continuum, 2010, 190pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441180001.

Reviewed by Lars Rensmann, University of Michigan at Ann Arbor


Michael Marder's Groundless Existence is, in more ways than one, a bold book. And it intends to be. It proposes far-reaching reinterpretations of Carl Schmitt's political thought, which Marder conceives in terms of a post-metaphysical, non-objectivist political ontology. In fact, Marder turns the German thinker into a founding father of an existential-phenomenological ontology of political subjectivity emerging "at the dusk of Western metaphysics." Situating Schmitt's theorizing in this distinct context, Marder seeks to disclose largely unexplored philosophical elements of Schmitt's political and legal theory. In Marder's account, Schmitt makes us understand "the political" categorically as a subjective-existential experience -- a subjective distinction that is not bound to particular societal spheres or ordering linearity but allows for, and epitomizes the possibility of, radical self-expropriation. Marder describes political existence as the "most intense," "forever precarious," "irreducible," "unstable," "groundless" and "raw" lived experience of human subjects, "whose very humanness is defined by the possibility of undergoing it." (4, 116). Political existence, in this reading, eludes predetermined political structures, laws, norms and ground-rules; it allegedly lacks any transcendental or objective grounding and is "immanently changeable and abounding in future possibilities." (79) This postfoundationalist interpretation and view of politics, which drives Marder's innovative book, elucidates features of Schmittian thought yet also pushes it to and beyond its limits (though Marder struggles to recognize the latter).

But Marder does not stop there. Inspired by the ontological philosophical underpinnings he attributes to Schmitt and unfolds in the first four chapters, Marder recasts the German theorist's critique of political modernity and applies it to fundamental issues that the political faces in the contemporary world (chapters 5 and 6). Marder does not shy away from offering bold political commentaries about the dominant liberal-democratic procedures, economic regimes, and political class of our time that presumably rule our lives and world -- all of which, he suggests, are politically oblivious, hopelessly entangled in the politico-economic system's structural imperatives, and all too eager to avoids risks and sovereign political decisions that shape our political existence. Moreover, in particular in the final two chapters, Marder seeks to disclose traces of existential political subjectivity's resuscitation, and hence ultimately to "recover" the possibility of political philosophy and politics. In chapter 7, he locates this in an anti-liberal "existentially vibrant," "radically pluralistic" and "repoliticized multiculturalism" that refuses to predelineate the "agonistic negotiation of cultural coexistence" by the "contrived sphere of universality," or, for that matter, by any other objectivist "neutralizing third" that is placed outside political subjectivity (149ff). Marder is doing so by turning, in a somewhat odd yet interesting move, to the logic of Roman Catholicism and the complexio oppositorum that determines it according to the early Schmitt.

In the final chapter, Marder intends to recapture the possibility of political renewal, understood in terms of existential decisions, in contemporary life by engaging with politics as a "hermeneutic endeavor." (170) Here we may find the book's most significant theoretical contribution. Marder employs Schmitt to suggest that every interpretation of the law, which cannot apply itself, always entails "an existential decision" that challenges rigorous liberal boundaries between active constitution-making capacity and mere passive applications of existing principles. For Marder, hermeneutical decisions by concrete subjects who interpret the law have become crucial loci of politics. By activating initially impersonal, abstract politico-legal structures and norms through acts of interpretation, political subjects often challenge and transgress those very norms and structures -- a process that liberal legalism, with its underlying fictions of neutrality and objectivity, tends to conceal. How far this critical -- let's say Adornian -- insight is in tune with Schmitt is, to be sure, a different matter.

Marder arrives at equally audacious and controversial claims by revisiting the totality of Schmitt's work, of which he displays an in-depth knowledge. Within the specific framework that he establishes and against the backdrop of this existential-phenomenological reading, Marder does a good job navigating through the sources and reconstructing the contours of what can be conceived as a post-Schmittian political ontology. Marder seeks to show, with Schmitt's assistance, that "the nothingness of subjectivity and sovereignty" emerges reductively and irreducibly in the wake of a fundamental modern crisis of metaphysics. Similar to Derridian deconstruction, the political and political events -- in Marder's reading -- existentially unground other domains of human activity and their 'objective' rules. Consequently, Marder attributes to "the political" a subversive role. Facing the "nothingness" of sovereign decisions on the exception, political subjectivity remains, he claims, "after the objective world of legality in which one had oriented oneself has collapsed, impotent to grant meaningful signposts for human action." (18) Marder brings to the fore what is arguably Schmitt's greatest contribution: the unmitigated recognition of a constitutive conflict between liberal constitutionalism and economism, on the one hand, and the raw democratic punch, the urge to unify will and law, on the other.

Fully to his credit, Marder also takes the conversation about Schmitt in new directions by mapping and exploring the potential interplay between the political theorist's work and Derrida (though he fails to work through the substantive differences between the two). Moreover, Marder seeks to rethink the relationship -- and reopen the dialogue -- between Schmitt and Husserlian phenomenology, Gadamer's hermeneutics, and Heidegger's "destruction." For instance, Marder persuasively illuminates how far Schmitt is indebted to, and informed by, Husserl -- even though it is a bit of a stretch to claim that Schmitt's work is "in harmony" with Husserl's phenomenological objectives (it is also rather questionable to suggest, as Marder does, that Husserl and Schmitt share a similar understanding of constitutive subjectivity and convergent goals of "vitalizing collective experience" in the face of the crisis of modernity).

However, the book's core hypotheses run into three major problems. First, Marder fails to persuasively show, pace Richard Wolin, that Schmitt's political ontology is essentially existential and "receives its critical strength from the irreducibility of the political subject." (115) This, to be sure, is not due to a lack of effort throughout the book. It is undoubtedly innovative to turn Schmitt into a postfoundationalist, non-objectivist and existential-phenomenological theorist whose work ungrounds our understanding of political existence. But doing so means, on several levels, transposing Schmitt's thought beyond recognition. It also means conjuring away many contradictions and substantive claims that shape Schmitt's theorizing.

Although Marder distinguishes between the early and late Schmitt, he tends to boldly mold Schmitt's thought into his framework and, in order to do so, has to deliberately exclude or play down what does not fit and "clashes with the letter of his texts." (78) For instance, Marder too lightly dismisses Schmitt's own explicitly articulated disdain towards both phenomenology and existentialism. Schmitt's own normativity is thereby only half-heartedly recognized; but his metaphysical nationalism, which Marder only mentions in passing and declares to be theoretically irrelevant, severely undermines the concept of a fluid, unstable political ontology. Make no mistake: there's plenty of substantive content in Schmitt's "political." Time and again in Schmitt, friends and their political "will" are defined primarily through the essentialized construct of their perceived enemy, as Derrida points out. Simultaneously, as Habermas reminds us, political subjects are, far from only facing nothingness, reified into an ethnic unity or naturalized Volksgeist, presupposing the homogeneity of members of a single ethnic people that shares a specific "substance" of common "natural" traits.[1]This is one of the meanings of "substantive democracy," whereby plebiscitary ethnic democracy -- epitomized in the Führerstaat -- expresses the collective will by the simple act of acclamation, which is in Schmitt's understanding "the natural and necessary life expression of every people."[2]

Considering its ethnicized grounding and unbridled collectivism, it is questionable to claim, as Marder does, that Schmitt's theory of identity and democratic identification are "incompatible" with the endorsement of a totalitarian state. Suggesting a complementary "double indeterminacy" of the enemy in Schmitt's notion, Marder also refuses to even consider that, at least temporarily, Schmitt's view of "the Jews" grounded a very specific conception of "the enemy."[3] Hence Marder reads "between the lines" that Schmitt formulates his theory against modern economic management and the liberal democratic state model; yet he fails to appropriately acknowledge the essentializing elements of Schmitt's thought and the specific content lurking behind his concepts. There are other textual contradictions, some of which Marder observes but which he ultimately portrays as irrelevant, even if they seriously complicate -- if not compromise -- Schmitt's presumed alliance with a truly existential-phenomenological understanding of politics. Think, for instance, of Schmitt's turn to a geopolitical Grossraum ideology that served to justify Nazi expansionism and which Franz Neumann so brilliantly criticized in Behemoth; it is difficult to reconcile this with Constitutional Theory, according to which the constitutive political subject defines "its own form of existence."[4]

The second problem is attached to the first. It affects the metaphysical grounding of the concept of the political itself. To be sure, Marder recognizes that Schmitt falls prey to an unquestioned metaphysical distinction between the elevated spiritual character of politics and the allegedly "spiritless" economy. But Marder insists on establishing Schmitt as a truly postmetaphysical thinker. He does so by emphasizing that, according to Schmitt, it is the 'sovereign' political decision that determines the will. This unified will, he proposes, is not an abstract potentiality but a historical power, i.e., it comes into being with that which is willed, by autonomous choice (textual counter-evidence of the will as a ready-made entity notwithstanding). In addition, Marder points out that Schmitt conceives the constitution as a special type of living form and as "the principle of dynamic emergence of political unity," enabling the formation of new unities and new connections between the form and content of politics. Criticizing the metaphysical purity illusion of mainstream jurisprudence, Schmitt may also be aware that conventional natural law and transcendental truths are obsolete and that there is no proper, ideal, "transhistorical mode of life befitting a concrete political unity once and for all" (79).

But historicization of the "concrete life," the critique of positive law, and the opposition to natural law are all insufficient to qualify for any robust dismissal of metaphysical groundings that Marder seeks to find in Schmitt. He only once critically acknowledges that Schmitt displays a reactionary drive to preserve one's "own" substantively predetermined form of existence against perceived existential threats. More importantly, Marder himself gets into troubled waters because he essentializes and hypostatizes politics in terms of the Schmittian "decisive confrontation with the enemy." He laments the "peril" of "a nihilistic indifference to one's group identity" while suggesting that for the political to triumph, "the figure of the enemy must loom large on the horizon of national, infranational, or transnational collectives." (138)

Say it ain't so, but such a notion of the political unconsciously adheres to a metaphysical, predetermined "natural law" of national self-preservation that ahistorically presupposes the need for existential struggles against (real or imagined) antagonistic Others. Proclaiming the inevitable necessity to forge a "unified political will," it can conceive of the political only in objectified terms of existential enemies and conflicts which it simultaneously helps to generate and which closes off the postmetaphysical political imagination. Marder also buys Schmitt's mantra that pacifist indecision will make "weak people" disappear, either through risk-avoidance or oblivion of what is narrowly construed as the political. Unwittingly, then, Marder discloses that Schmitt's spiritually elevated "political" renders political subjectivity the ultimately passive historical status of subject-objects of a 'community of fate'. The political thereby pushes "us to the extremity of the limit," Marder declares, where "the sovereign decision on the exception and the real possibility of killing and being killed by the enemy grips and unsettles us, making life both interesting and dangerous." (75) Thus, Marder himself appropriates Schmitt's metaphysically loaded concept that ontologizes history, instead of taking Derrida's claim more seriously that Schmitt is "the last great metaphysician of politics" who displays "reactive stubbornness" in restoring uncompromising binary distinctions.[5]

Finally, I have my doubts that the critique of (liberal) political modernity that Marder relaunches with Schmitt's support can, or should, categorically renounce on any "neutralizing" foundations and institutions, which Marder a priori defines as "oppressive." To be sure, Marder makes an important argument by pointing to the contested, political character of legal norms and their hermeneutic reiterations. Formal legal systems allow for pluralism but fail to recognize how and when they standardize political subjectivity and exclude the nonidentical, heterogeneous, contingent that evades legal principles. Moreover, modern institutional objectifications indeed tend to undermine fluid political subjectivity. Denying this structural bias, contemporary liberal theorists are often too obsessed with legality and stability; they get scared of all unexpected articulations of demoi that may disrupt orderly formal procedures and legal transitions. Such modern liberal legalism is troubled by thepolitics of transgression even when old laws and constitutions obviously fail their citizens.

But instead of recovering the critical potential of a political reading of modern laws and the effects of liberal institutions, Marder rigorously replicates Schmitt's extreme anti-liberalism and anti-legalism that bolsters his undifferentiated, scathing critique of modernity. In this understanding, liberal political modernity's constitutional frameworks are reduced to "liberal administrative escapism" and "legitimacy by legality," presumably producing manifold strata of "impersonal and dead political existence" (8) while making the recognition of "the enemy . . . structurally impossible" (35). Political recognition, he suggests, always requires the elimination of any "neutral third." The rule of law, universal (human and civil) rights claims, cosmopolitan norms: all are unambiguously rejected as modern liberal de-politicizations, i.e., "the norm" that strips parties to the conflict of their decision-making ability and "stands for sham neutrality that surreptitiously caters to particular interests." (77) While Marder dismisses any general standard of judgment -- and especially the "constitutional ideal of bourgeois individualism"[6] -- his diagnosis that agonistic political experience is completely suffocated by modernity's laws and institutions is, however, driven by strong presuppositions. It is indebted to a world view that adopts Schmitt's concepts and his ubiquitous crisis discourse. It vigorously laments liberal democracy and the pacification of conflicts, while failing to develop a determinate critique of liberalism and global political modernity's contradictions.

Marder's book is a significant contribution to understanding Schmitt's philosophical underpinnings and political ontology. It facilitates a fresh and innovative conversation about possible politico-philosophical links between Schmitt, phenomenology, existentialism, and deconstructivism. The theoretical value of Marder's work is undermined, however, by its unmitigated partiality and politico-philosophical posturing. Turning Schmitt into an Übertheorist whose writings allegedly provide "the most ground-breaking political ideas of the past century," (3) Marder plays down substantive problems and, to a considerable extent, reiterates them. Too often prefering categorical purity over nuance or critical self-reflection of Schmitt's many ambiguities and limitations, Groundless Existencethus in part restricts the very existential-phenomenological understanding of politics that it intends to enhance.

[1] Jürgen Habermas, The Inclusion of the Other (Cambridge: Polity, 2002), 135. Habermas, of course, is one of the thinkers that Marder charges with liberal political oblivion and the "dangerous" denial of the political.

[2] Carl Schmitt, Constitutional Theory (Durham, NC: Duke University Press, 2008), 131.

[3] Raphael Gross, Carl Schmitt and the Jews (Madison: University of Wisconsin Press, 2007).

[4] Carl Schmitt, Constitutional Theory, 121.

[5] Jacques Derrida, The Politics of Friendship (London and New York: Verso, 2005), 246f.

[6] Carl Schmitt, The Concept of the Political (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996), 169.