Groundless Grounds: A Study of Wittgenstein and Heidegger

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Lee Braver, Groundless Grounds: A Study of Wittgenstein and Heidegger, MIT Press, 2012, 354pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016896.

Reviewed by Gary E. Aylesworth, Eastern Illinois University


Ludwig Wittgenstein and Martin Heidegger are the two most influential philosophers of the twentieth century. Though they were aware of one another, each made only one recorded mention of the other, and these were made in passing. These remarks open a narrow pathway into a large field of investigation. However, perhaps because they came to represent opposing camps of professional philosophers, few have attempted to read them so as to bring them into productive dialogue. Lee Braver's publication is the latest of these relatively rare efforts. His general thesis is that, despite their differences, Wittgenstein and Heidegger both insist upon our radical finitude as human beings, and that there is an unsurpassable limit to the reasons we give as to why things are the way they are. In other words, reason as a ground-giving activity cannot ground itself, but arises out of our situation in a world that is always already "there" before the question of grounds or reasons can arise in the first place. In developing this thesis, Braver hopes to begin a dialogue between so-called analytic and continental philosophers and to inaugurate a re-appropriation of the philosophical tradition on the basis of mutual understanding. That is to say, he believes his study can lead "analysts" and "continentalists" to agree on what philosophy is, on what it has been, and on what it ought to become. Given the institutional divisions within professional philosophy, in place for two or more generations, this is no small ambition, and it is unlikely to meet with a friendly reception from all quarters (see Richard Rorty).

As a matter of strategy, Braver begins each chapter with an account of the early Wittgenstein, who then functions as a critical target for the later Wittgenstein and as a stand-in for the metaphysical tradition that Heidegger, early and late, seeks to overcome. Chapter 1 presents both thinkers as calling for an "end" to philosophy as it has been practiced in the past, which for Braver means the assumption of a disengaged theoretical stance over and above our everyday ways of speaking and dealing with things in the world. The paradigm case of philosophical theorizing is Wittgenstein's famous positing,in the Tractatus of a logically perfect language beneath the irregular and disorderly uses of ordinary speech. Braver gives a detailed account of the later Wittgenstein's rejection of this position, including criticisms of the assertions that all meaningful propositions must have a single form, that elementary propositions constitute a set of linguistic atoms whose combinations are calculable, and that the complete set of their possible combinations delimits language (and the world) as a limited whole. Once the later Wittgenstein realizes that language cannot be reduced to one function, the project of the Tractatus collapses under the untenability of its basic assumptions. While noting their fundamental differences, Braver argues that Heidegger's analysis in Being and Time of objects "present at hand" closely parallels Wittgenstein's criticisms of the misleading confusions created by philosophers when they focus upon one example, such as propositional statements, as a model for all cases. Just as Wittgenstein insists there is no actual problem with language as long as we attend to the particularity of each "move" in a language game, Heidegger grounds the traditional view of things as present objects within the network of our involvements with things "ready at hand," a network that constitutes a world we already understand.

In the second chapter, Braver extends his account of the Tractatus, in which Wittgenstein theorizes that elementary propositions mirror the organization of objects into the states of affairs that make up the world. Metaphysically, objects are nothing but the set of all of their combinatory possibilities, including the combinations they are actually in. In this way, Wittgenstein seeks to anchor the sense of language in a logical space where primitive propositions name the "meaning-bodies" of the world and isomorphically "picture" them in their combinations in states of affairs. However, as noted in chapter 1, the later Wittgenstein rejects this schema as the answer to an unnecessary worry about grounding linguistic sense in an objectively determinable world. This worry dissolves once we realize that our involvements with the world are already in order, and that philosophy gets caught up in nonsense of its own making by taking things out of their natural contexts, e.g., by looking for the "meaning" of meaning. Braver suggests that Heidegger carries out a similar critique of traditional theorizing in Being and Time when he describes the derivative nature of things as present-at-hand objects (the mode of traditional metaphysics and epistemology) in contrast to our close involvement with things in their usefulness, prior to any objectification.

In chapter 3, Braver provides more detail on the holism of human actions as described by both thinkers. Here, he comments on Wittgenstein's rejection of the notion of a private language in the Philosophical Investigations, which he suggests is not so much an argument as a series of examples illustrating the uselessness of such an idea. First of all, we learn language by interacting with others, and thus we can refer our private feelings to ourselves only after we have learned how to refer and how to distinguish between "private" and "public" in the first place. Thus the sense of what is private is derivative upon non-private communication, and there is, then, a holistic connection between any so-called private language and language's ordinary uses. Braver links this with Heidegger's holism in his description of tools in Being and Time, where the use of a tool, such as a hammer, presupposes a non-thematic understanding of an entire world of references within which the hammer functions, and this includes involvements with other human beings (other Dasein). In this regard, our existential being-in-the-world is our primary experience of everything, and it must simply be described rather than theoretically reconstructed, for such reconstruction would be a falsification.

Braver carries these considerations over into chapter 4, which focuses upon the nature of thinking. He presents in considerable detail Wittgenstein's critique of the modernist model of thinking as viewing images in a mental picture-gallery. As Wittgenstein points out, much of what we call knowing or understanding does not involve any particular mental activity, and can be accounted for perfectly well by attending to what we do in various situations. This parallels Heidegger's description of everyday understanding in Being and Time, and Braver suggests that both Heidegger and Wittgenstein embrace what he calls the Perceptual Model of Thought. As he says: "Rather than weighing the pros and cons of an array of options confronting us, we simply see what is to be done in a given situation" (p. 141). As Braver notes, there is a certain passivity to perceptual thinking, in contrast to the intellectualist models of thought favored by modern thinkers, including Husserlian phenomenologists and analytic philosophers. As he points out, the later Heidegger, in particular, emphasizes the passivity of thinking in his notion of Gelassenheit, or releasement toward things. In addition, he argues that there is an affinity between the Perceptual Model of Thought and Aristotle's characterization of ethical judgment as phronesis.

In chapter 5, Braver argues that the later Wittgenstein and Heidegger are anti-foundationalists in accounting for a certain deceptiveness in the search for ultimate "grounds" or "reasons." For Wittgenstein, this takes the form of an illusion of greater depth beneath the ground that lies on the surface, while Heidegger states it in terms of an event of being that is a groundless "giving" of grounds. This constitutes what Braver calls the Framework Argument: "we cannot judge the rules of a game or the framework of a discussion by criteria applicable within it" (p. 180). For Wittgenstein, this means any attempt to ground language games in an independently existing reality is, if it makes sense, a move in a certain language game. Furthermore, it means that the search for such an ultimate ground is a philosophical disease that can be cured when we understand that the obviousness of knowing how to play a language game is itself the only ground to be had. This extends to the rules of reason, such as the law of excluded middle, which is a rule for certain language games, but not one that all language games must necessarily follow. Braver argues that the early Heidegger's anti-foundationalism is compromised by his call for authenticity in Dasein's existence, which Braver reads as suggesting that there is an authentic self that one can enact. However, he finds in Heidegger's epochal history of being the sense that our understanding of being, and thus of the ground of beings, takes different shapes at different times. These epochs are "sendings" or "givings" of grounds, and are thus themselves groundless. Braver notes that Wittgenstein's thinking is not essentially historical, but suggests Heidegger's epoch's of being can be lined up with Wittgenstein's "strange tribes" who play alternate language games (p. 197). As an example, Braver argues that Heidegger's remark on the principle of reason, i.e., there is no reason why everything must have a reason, can be taken as generally equivalent to Wittgenstein's observation that language games do not ultimately justify themselves, but are simply played or not played.

In concluding chapter 5, Braver introduces a discussion of David Hume's insistence that the practices of ordinary life must ultimately trump any attempt to provide them with metaphysical foundations; the best we can do is to clarify that reason is an instinct that cannot ground or explain itself, and that this insight changes nothing in common life and experience. Braver thus invokes Hume to reinforce the deflationary spirit of his readings of Heidegger and Wittgenstein (and probably to show analytic philosophers that Heidegger can be read as a "philosopher" in their sense): "All three want to return us to what we already know in or usual comings and goings, by exposing reason's limitations -- its finitude, its dependence on factors that escape rational analysis or legitimation" (p. 219). This statement may be taken as the main point of the entire book.

Braver concludes by reiterating that human finitude is, for Wittgenstein and Heidegger, philosophy's point of departure and final destination. The difference between them, he argues, is that Heidegger begins with human finitude in Being and Time, whereas Wittgenstein arrives at it via his own critique of the Tractatus. Nevertheless, Braver regards Heidegger's early attempt to work out a fundamental ontology of Dasein as a piece of essentialism in its own right, insofar as it suggests that we can view our finitude sub specie aeterni in terms of Dasein's unchanging existentialia. On this reading, Heidegger only moves past this remnant of metaphysics when he turns to Gelassenheit (openness toward beings) in his later writings. For Braver, it is no coincidence that language moves to the forefront in the later Heidegger Braver seeks to make it a weight-bearing bridge between Heidegger's meditations on being and Wittgenstsein's reflections on grammar. In emphasizing this connection, however, he downplays the sense of mystery in Heidegger compared with Wittgenstein's critique of the need for mystery as a symptom of the desire to transcend finitude (a need expressed in the Tractatus as the mystical). While acknowledging this difference, Braver does not account for it in detail, nor does he address the further difference beneath it: the sense of finitude as historical, that is, as temporal facticity, as opposed to finitude as the limit of a non-epochal space.

Missing in Braver's account is Heidegger's deeply historical sense of language itself and of metaphysical thinking, such that "saying" and "thinking" are gathered together in an inception that has remained unthought and unsaid since the Greeks, but whose recovery he finds hinted at in the poetry of Hölderlin. For Heidegger, this calls for deep engagement with the historical tradition and with language as the bearer of an "unsaid" from the past. For Wittgenstein, by contrast, the temporality of language is not essential -- a mark, no doubt, of Schopenhauer's influence on his thinking. Instead, he depicts the historicality of language in terms of an old European city, with its ancient center of narrow and irregular paths, and its modern outer districts with linear streets and uniform houses (Philosophical Investigations, 16). There is no epochal temporality here, but only spatial accumulation and extension. Perhaps a deeper dialogue between the two philosophers, a dialogue drawn out of this radical difference, would take a step beyond comparing their similarities, however compelling these might be.

As to the difference between analytic and continental philosophy, we might begin by recognizing it as a construction of professional philosophers rather than something essential to philosophy itself. More to the point, both Wittgenstein and Heidegger had plenty to say about the professionalization of philosophy and its deleterious effects. Perhaps Braver could have applied some of their criticisms to the tired and tiresome divisions he is seeking to mend.