Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals: A German-English Edition

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Immanuel Kant, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of MoralsA German-English Edition, Mary Gregor and Jens Timmermann (eds., trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2011, 198pp., $85.00, ISBN 9780521514576.

Reviewed by Arnulf Zweig, University of Oregon


As stated on the dust cover, this volume contains the first facing-page German-English edition of Kant's Groundwork. The German text is, in its spelling and punctuation, close to Kant's original, a decision that gives some of Kant's words a charmingly archaic appearance; e.g., seyn, Eintheilung, zweyte, rather than sein, Einteilung, zweite. Pagination of the standard Prussian Academy of Sciences edition of 1903 is helpfully given in the left hand margins of the German pages. Kant's second edition, published in 1786, which corrects some of the errors in the printing of the first edition of 1785, is the basic text.

Serious students of Kant will be grateful to Mr. Timmermann for making available a reliable edition of Kant's own words, along with a fastidious word-for-word English translation, and both of these together in one small volume. Compared to other German editions, this one, at $85, is a bit expensive. (The German editions published by Philipp Reclam or Felix Meiner Verlag are currently priced under 13 EUR.) For Anglophone readers, there are also currently a half dozen more than adequate English translations easily obtainable, and some of these are easier to read than this one -- easier both in darkness of the print (my copy looks very pale except for the bold page numbers in the Editorial Notes) and in rendering Kantian sentences into English-sounding prose. But having the German and English texts facing each other, the way the famous Loeb edition of Greek and Roman classics does, is a great convenience. Perhaps someday Kant's other works will be given a similar treatment.

Timmermann has taken Mary Gregor's English translation and revised it here and there, but on the whole it is her version that is presented. (Not all the emendations are felicitous. See my remarks on "unsittlich," below.) Editorial notes and a bilingual index are included -- the index is very thorough -- but as Timmermann explains, his editorial notes avoid philosophical controversies occasioned by Kant's claims and do not serve as a guide to Kant's thought. An introductory note is extremely interesting in discussing some of the ways German has changed since Kant's day. Readers wanting help in understanding Kant's arguments should consult commentaries, of which there are currently quite a few. Timmermann himself has authored one that purports to explain Kant's arguments in the Groundwork paragraph by paragraph (Cambridge University Press, 2007.)

For readers who know some German and want to know exactly what Kant actually wrote, rather than how his words have been interpreted or misinterpreted by his disciples and critics, there is much to be said for acquiring this edition of Kant's most famous work in ethics. But reading Kant, whether in English or German, can be frustratingly difficult. For contemporary readers especially, his style of writing is after all that of the eighteenth century and his convoluted sentences, though sometimes eloquent and inspiring, can be a deterrent and a distraction from the power of his insights. That was true even for native German readers in Kant's own day. Moses Mendelssohn called Kant's first Critique "this nerve-juice consuming book," and while the Groundwork is much plainer than the Critique, I doubt that a word like Begehrungsvermögen would have received nods of recognition from Kant's dinner guests. (An amusing confirmation of how formidable Kant's prose looked to his contemporaries: when Kant asked his old school friend Johann Heinrich Wlömer, whether he ever wanted to read any of Kant's books, Wloemer replied, "Oh yes, and I'd do it more but I ran out of fingers." "How's that?" asked Kant. Wloemer: "Well, dear friend, your prose style is so full of brackets and stipulations on which I have to keep my eye, what I do is put a finger on one, then the second, third, fourth, and before I can turn the page my fingers are all used up." See Kant, Correspondence, Cambridge University Press, 1999, p. 615.)

I think that Mary Gregor's scrupulous translation, with or without Timmermann's changes, would not have eased old Wloemer's pain. Her own style is highly formal; she sounds like Kant. Her translation seems to be intended mainly for other scholars, readers sophisticated in philosophy and at ease with the English of the highly educated. Words such as "propaedeutic," "assertorical," and "appetition" are not part of the working vocabulary even of fairly literate English speakers. Nor are the difficulties in reading this English Groundwork limited to Kant's vocabulary. Gregor and Timmermann are not only faithful to his words; they replicated his syntax. Take a comparatively short and simple example; Kant writes:

Man denke doch ja nicht, daß man das, was hier gefodert wird, schon an der Propädevtik des berühmten Wolf vor seiner Moralphilosophie, der von ihm so genannten allgemeinen practischen Weltweisheit, habe, und hier also nicht eben ein ganz neues Feld einzuschlagen sey.

The translation:

However, let it not be thought that what is here called for already exists in the guise of the propaedeutic of the famous Wolff for his moral philosophy, namely that which he called Universal Practical Philosophy, and that we do not therefore have to open up an entirely new field. (IV, 390 l.20 ff.)

The translation mirrors Kant's construction (I believe grammarians call it the optative subjunctive). There is of course a certain pleasure in deciphering Kant's lengthy sentences, looking for the referent of his pronouns, and puzzling over the sequence of his clauses -- a pleasure that helps to motivate Kant translators! For many readers, however, reading Kant would be more rewording if it were less like an obstacle course.

In the interest of full disclosure, this reviewer must admit to being a translator and co-author, with Thomas E. Hill Jr., of a competing English edition of the Groundwork, published in the Oxford Philosophical Texts series. Our edition, unlike the Gregor/Timmermann, was meant to be a teaching edition, giving critical guidance concerning the context and main arguments of this classic text. I am probably biased therefore in disagreeing with Timmermann when he asserts that all translations "inevitably obscure the author's arguments." I think Kant's arguments become less obscure when one takes into account the needs and limitations of readers. Of course that entails some compromise with the ideal of an exact translation. In this rigorous translation even dummy words like "aber" and "doch" are not neglected. Whether this enhances one's philosophical understanding is another question. Granted, it's a joy to struggle with and triumph over some of Kant's sentences, and from the point of view of historical and linguistic interests, the ideal of absolute fidelity cannot be faulted. But word for word and clause for clause translation is no favor to the struggling reader who seeks to grasp the arguments buried in those sentences. One way to mitigate the difficulty of Kant's style without distorting his arguments would be to divide up his elegantly opaque and overly long sentences into "accessible bites" (as Francine Baker puts it, in her Kantian Review discussion of recent Groundwork translations). That is evidently not a procedure countenanced by Gregor or Timmermann.

Although the translation is on the whole exceptionally accurate, I have found a few choices with which I would quibble. The title of the book is one. How should we translate "Grundlegung" and "zur" in the title Grundlegung zur Metaphysic der Sitten? Translations I have seen render "Grundlegung" as "Fundamental Principles" (T. K. Abbott), "Groundwork" (H. J. Paton, A. Wood, T. E. Hill Jr. and A. Zweig), "Foundations" (L. W. Beck), and "Grounding" (J.W. Ellington). Some say Groundwork for the Metaphysics of Morals, others Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals. The differences between these seem slight -- the word "Grundlegung" can mean anything that underlies and supports, or that something can be built upon -- e.g., an architectural structure, a house, or even metaphorically a proof. But one could argue, pedantically, that the plural "foundations" or "principles" is mistaken. That was the considered view of the late Lewis White Beck who pointed out to me that his own translation's choice of the plural term "Foundations" was in error -- as was also Abbott's "Fundamental Principles" -- since it is an important part of Kant's theory that there is only one foundation for the various principles of duty surveyed and defended in the Metaphysics of Morals, viz., the Categorical Imperative.

One might be equally pedantic about another word in the German title: the little word "zur". Is the Groundwork the grounding or foundation "of" or "for" his projected Metaphysics of Morals? A translator's decision could rest on how much weight is put on Kant's remark (4: 391, l.37) that the Grundlegung is a separate work. What we have is a foundation for a book yet to be written. What difference does it make? While it seems a trivial linguistic issue, illustrative of how picky translators can be, the choice implies something about the structure of Kant's theory. Allen Wood and this reviewer take Kant's statement in the Groundwork as decisive and render "zur" as "for" rather than "of": the Groundwork is a necessary prelude or foundation for the various duties articulated in the later work. Timmermann, Gregor, and Paton, in their reading of zur, tacitly reject or overlook Kant's remark.

My disagreement with the translation of unsittlich at 4:390 is not so trivial. Timmermann changes Gregor's "a ground that is not moral" to "the immoral ground." I think this is wrong. In everyday German the word can certainly mean "immoral," but that is not how Kant uses it here, where he is contrasting actions that happen to conform to the moral law (coincidently, one might say) from actions done just because of such conformity. Evidently noticing that in this context "immoral" would be linguistically correct but philosophically mistaken, Paton (and Hill and Zweig, among others) chose "non-moral" for unsittlich; Beck has "unmoral." My collaborator Professor Hill has a long, useful footnote, n.7, p.264, in our edition, that mentions examples of various "non-moral" grounds Kant discusses in the first section of the Groundwork -- the profit motive, sympathy, self-preservation, the desire for happiness (4:397-9). The distinction Kant is concerned with is that of actions done "out of duty" and actions that may be consistent with morality but are not motivated by it. Surely he does not think of the latter as "immoral" in the way actions contrary to duty -- unsittlich in the pejorative sense -- are.

Timmermann's bilingual Index of Key Terms will be of great utility to any reader. The index is very thorough, so if for example one wanted to see what Kant means by "inclinations" and where exactly he claimed that a rational being would wish not to have any inclinations at all, one could find it in this index under Neigung (inclination). The definition of "inclination" at 4: 428 as the 'dependence of the desiderative faculty on sensations' may be puzzling. I suspect a lot of people would be thrown by "desiderative." (Other translators use "faculty of desire" which is a little easier than "desiderative.") But working through the long list of references to 'inclination' will help. Since references are to the Academy pagination, rather than to page numbers in Gregor/Timmermann, one has to do a bit of searching to find the relevant passages, but this is not a serious problem.

For students fluent in German but not in Kant's German, Timmermann's editorial Notes on the translation (pp. 161-173) are full of interesting information, e.g., about ordinary German words that have changed their meaning. A note on the word "Reich" caught my eye. Like other translators, Timmermann notices that the common translation 'kingdom,' (as in Kant's famous phrase, "kingdom of ends") might better be rendered as 'realm' or 'commonwealth'. As a former refugee from another Reich, I enjoyed his ironic remark, "There is little temptation to leave the word untranslated."