Group Agency: The Possibility, Design, and Status of Corporate Agents

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Christian List and Philip Pettit, Group Agency: The Possibility, Design, and Status of Corporate Agents, Oxford University Press, 2011, 238pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199591565.

Reviewed by Raimo Tuomela, University of Helsinki


In this book, Christian List and Philip Pettit argue that group agents are real and irreducible, in a straightforward functional sense, to individual agents and their beliefs and preferences. They do this while holding on to methodological individualism, the doctrine that all explanations of the social world are to be couched essentially in terms of individuals and their properties. The tension between these two claims forms the main philosophical interest of this book, which also includes important    work in judgment aggregation theory that is integrated to the theory of group agents created in the book.

The book consists of three parts consisting of three chapters each. First we have "The Logical Possibility of Group Agents," containing the chapters "The Conditions of Agency," "The Aggregation of Intentional Attitudes," and "The Structure of Group Agents." The second part is "The Organizational Design of Group Agents," consisting of "The Epistemic Desideratum," "The Incentive-Compatibility Desideratum," and "The Control Desideratum." The third part is "The Normative Status of Group Agents," and it consists of "Holding Group Agents Responsible," "Personifying Group Agents," and "Identifying With Group Agents." There is also an informative Introduction.

An agent is assumed to satisfy the following three rather uncontroversial criteria for agency, proposed in the first chapter of the book.  An agent has:

  1. representational states that depict how things are in the environment.
  2. motivational states that specify how it requires things to be in the environment.
  3. the capacity to process its representational and motivational states, leading it to intervene in the environment whenever that environment fails to match a motivating specification.

Assuming that these criteria are both necessary and sufficient for agency, List and Pettit go on to argue that group agents may satisfy these criteria and hence count as real agents, rejecting what they call eliminativism about group agency. They nevertheless claim to hold a version of methodological individualism, since they go against the rather obsolete view that group agency must contain some mysterious kind of spirit, or vis vitalis, that adheres to group agents in addition to aggregates of individuals.

The version of methodological individualism that List and Pettit are committed to is very permissive, as it allows even the existence of irreducible group agents as long as no mysterious ontic stuff over and above their individual members is postulated. List and Pettit say that group agents holistically supervene on their members, but they do not discuss the ground of the supervenience, i.e., whether the supervenience is conceptual, epistemic or ontological (e.g. causal). In any case, supervenience is important in that it shows with some precision how aggregates of individual attitudes produce group attitudes. Supervenience also gives a group agent some autonomy. The authors' notion of supervenience roughly expresses that individual facts necessarily fix (or determine) group facts (p. 65). Supervenient group facts are not strictly definitionally reducible to individual facts as supervenience is not symmetric.

Group agents are -- somewhat provocatively for an individualistic approach -- claimed to be "relatively autonomous entities -- agents in their own right with minds of their own" (p. 77). This conclusion is supported primarily by epistemic and methodological considerations relating to the difficulty and complexity of deriving group-level facts from individual-level facts (the supervenience basis). There are practical problems connected to the assumed sufficiency of the determination of group facts by the supervenience basis, and there is multiple realizability, which speaks against the necessity of a particular set of individual facts. The phrase "minds of their own" above might suggest the idea of intrinsic intentionality, whileextrinsic intentionality clearly is the authors' view, in light of the epistemic and functionalistic perspective that they adopt (see, e.g., p. 75 and Chapter 8).

In which specific sense, then, are group agents real? List and Pettit (p. 9) reject the idea that "group agency requires something above and beyond the emergence of coordinated, psychologically intelligible dispositions in individual members". When their view is described in group-level language and when the satisfaction of the supervenience requirement is assumed, we roughly have all that there ontologically is to the matter: a group agent is an agent that consists of individual persons with suitable coordinated dispositions to think and act such that the group properties holistically supervene on those dispositions (and their manifestations).

As to the formation of group agents, List and Pettit say that the joint intention to form a group around a shared goal is the basic way of forming a group (p. 33). Here joint intention is individualistic joint intention. Given such a group, a story about how its attitudes are aggregatively rationally formed is told. So the basic setup for the discussion is that there is a group agent having individual members as its constituents. The group's attitudes are formed from the individual attitudes and activities, and the relation between the individual and the group level must be that of supervenience. As to the roles of the members of a jointly intentional group, they may play one or both of two roles: authorizing the group agent to represent them or acting "in full awareness for the pursuit of the group's ends." (p. 35).

The formal results of the book are mostly based on rational choice theory and emphasize the role of aggregation in the formation of binary-valued rational group attitudes. List and Pettit assume that the aggregation function has to respect four rationality constraints for democratic contexts (Chapter 2). They are versions of familiar constraints used in the literature and are here termed Universal DomainCollective Rationality, Anonymity, and Systematicity. These conditions can be applied both to (binary-valued) attitudes with the mind-to-world direction of fit (e.g., views, beliefs, judgments) and to attitudes with the world-to-mind direction of fit (e.g., goals, preferences). List and Pettit prove the following result in Chapter 2: there exists no aggregation function satisfying universal domain, collective rationality, anonymity, and systematicity. Yet, any three of these four conditions can be satisfied together. It can be noted that a generalization of this theorem entails Arrow's impossibility theorem. The authors consider different possibilities to get out of the inconsistency and end up arguing that a relaxation of the systematicity requirement by prioritizing certain propositions over others gives the best solution.

As said, it is required, in accordance with methodological individualism, that the group's attitudes must be fixed in some way by a suitable mathematical function in terms of the individual members' attitudes. The right kind of relation of determination (a general description of such a function) according to the book is the following kind of (holistic) supervenience (p. 69):

Holistic supervenience: The set of group attitudes across propositions is determined by the individual sets of attitudes across these propositions.

List and Pettit argue that for their account of group agency to be vindicated (i.e., for group agency to be both real and non-trivial relative to their three proposed criteria), the supervenience relation must satisfy the following rationality criterion (p. 67):

Robust group rationality: The supervenience relation determines consistent and complete group attitudes on the relevant propositions for any possible profile of consistent and complete member attitudes on these propositions.

Of the notions of supervenience considered by the authors, only holistic supervenience is argued to be consistent with robust group rationality, whereas other supervenience relations (e.g., majoritarian or other kinds of proposition-wise supervenience) may lead to failures of rationality. Holistic supervenience also has the following feature: in the case of the premise-based procedure in a "discursive dilemma" the individual attitudes in a simple inference from p and q to p&q will be sufficient to determine the group's attitude on the conclusion p&q (p. 70). Yet the individuals' attitudes on p&q may be both insufficient and unnecessary for determining the group's attitude on that complex proposition. This gives the group a certain autonomy in relation to its members. Still, against this autonomy argument the point can be made that it is nevertheless the members (or, anyhow, some individuals) who decide about the group's decision procedure.

Finally, it can be asked which group decision methods qualify. The authors mention regular and distributed premise-based procedures and sequential priority procedures as examples of methods that satisfy both holistic supervenience and robust group rationality (p. 72).

One shortcoming of the book is that it does not properly discuss competing contemporary views in social ontology and collective intentionality about the reality and robustness of group agents. This is all the more surprising given that List and Pettit argue that forming a relevant joint intention is one of the most important ways of constituting a group agent. There are many different views of collective and joint intentionality in the literature, some individualistic, others collectivistic. For instance, the authors do not discuss Michael Bacharach's (2006)team reasoning approach in game theory, Margaret Gilbert's (2006) plural subject account, or my own account based on functional group agents.

To comment briefly on my own approach, this "we-mode" approach (as developed especially in my 2007 and 2011 books) uses as its central starting point the distinction between acting as a group member versus acting as a private person. Acting as a group member in relation to one's salient group in terms of a "we" amounts to we-mode acting, and similarly for having an attitude. We get a distinction between conceptually group-dependent attitudes, viz. we-mode attitudes and activities, on the one hand, and I-mode (or private, although sometimes group-oriented) attitudes and activities, on the other hand. The approach regards group agents as being based on collective acceptance ("construction") by its members as entified groups with constitutive goals, beliefs, norms, etc. (a shared "ethos") to which the members are collectively committed. The we-mode/I-mode distinction is not used in the List-Pettit theory. Indeed, as we-mode properties are logically group-dependent they cannot be used noncircularly to account for a group's attitudes. In contrast to the List-Pettit account mine is based on we-mode activities, not I-mode ones. Accordingly, a group agent's action in my account is based on the members acting fully as group members, thus in the we-mode. Note that we-mode attitudes are guided by the group's ethos and thus that attitude consistency over time is guaranteed by the ethos that has the function of maintaining group identity.

The contrast made in my account between collectively and privately held attitudes (etc.) can be connected to Bacharach's game-theoretic framework by distinguishing between two types of questions that an individual agent functioning in a group context may pose herself in action contexts (Hakli et al. 2011): "What should I do (given my expectations about the others' actions)?" as contrasted with "What should we do as a group?" The latter is a we-mode question, answers to which in some contexts do generate different functional predictions (due to different action equilibria) from answers to the former, I-mode question. This indicates that individualism does not suffice for adequate social theorizing but needs to be complemented by collectivistic ingredients such as we-mode notions (thus, e.g., non-aggregative group attitudes).

One would have expected more substantive exploration of the theoretical terrain in this domain from the authors of the present book. To be sure, they discuss some historical views such as the "authorization theory" (Hobbes et al.) and the "animation theory" (von Gierke et al.). Another distinction taken up (in Chapter 3) is "emergentism" (a broader version of the animation theory), which does not accept the supervenience idea, and "eliminativism," which denies the existence of groups altogether. But again, they do not consider how recent accounts fit into the picture. (E.g., in my own account there need not be supervenience concerning I-mode properties.)

To briefly comment on Chapters 4-6, the following desiderata for well-functioning group agents are discussed by List and Pettit: the epistemic, the incentive-compatibility, and thecontrol desiderata. I will not discuss them at depth here but only say what they contain and what some of the results achieved are. The epistemic one requires that the group be able adequately to acquire true information about the world. It is shown in terms of mathematically formulated results in Chapter 4 that given certain conditions a group agent can benefit from "democratization," "decomposition," and "decentralization." As to the incentive-compatibility desideratum (Chapter 5), the authors say that individuals will often pursue their own (seeming or true) advantage rather than that of the group. Therefore special organizational or behavioural constraints for a group agent are required so that it becomes incentive-compatible in the sense of being resilient to strategic individual action. (For instance, in a Prisoner's Dilemma based on objective payoffs the utilitarian or, in my terminology, "jointness" transformation makes cooperation rational.) The control desideratum (Chapter 6) concerns the use of power and requires that group agents be organized so that they respect the members' rights and freedoms. The desideratum says that if an individual has a positive (negative) attitude on a proposition then the group also has it. It is shown that this strong desideratum holds under certain specific conditions.

The three final chapters in the book, which compose its third part, are non-technical. Chapter 7 presents Pettit's previously available account of group responsibility. Chapter 8 discusses conditions for personhood, arguing that there may be group persons that yet are different in some important respects from individual persons. What conditions do (group) persons have to satisfy other than the aforementioned three conditions of (group) agency? The authors prefer to view group persons in a performative sense rather than regarding them as intrinsic. Drawing on historical work including Thomas Hobbes, List and Pettit argue that functioning as a person consists in giving one's word to others, claiming the ability to represent to others what one thinks and wants, and in living up to the expectations this representation supports under local conventions of honesty and fidelity. Personhood accordingly is a special normative status over and above rational agency. A person is an agent who can perform effectively in the space of obligations. Chapter 9 discusses identification with a group. The authors take the individual in her individual identity to be the basis of identification. Individual identity is also prior to rationality (here presumably only individual rationality is meant).

Let me note that some of the arguments put forth in these three final chapters are not fully satisfactory in contrast to the generally high quality of the book. Thus, in Chapter 7 (pp. 155-156, 158) three necessary conditions for fitness to be held responsible are proposed and they are also assumed and indeed claimed, totally without argument, to be jointly sufficient, but on p. 165 the joint sufficiency is yet used for attributing responsibility to group agents.

These final chapters, together with Chapter 3, also contain some interesting historical material on the treatment of groups as corporate agents in legal theory and political philosophy, beginning with Roman law and spanning from the middle ages to contemporary legislation. It can be pointed out here that some social theorists at the end of the nineteenth and the beginning of the twentieth century also discussed the possibility of group agents, although List and Pettit seem to be oblivious to this historical strand of the debate over collective agency. Thus Ferdinand Tönnies, Alfred Vierkandt, and William McDougall can be mentioned as theoreticians who have advocated some version of the group agency idea. (I have recently discussed them in Tuomela 2011.)

Despite my aforementioned critical points, the book is a fine intellectual achievement in that it presents important new work in rational choice theory and gives an account of group agents and persons that concurs with individualism. It will surely be widely read and discussed not only by philosophers but also by rational choice theorists and social scientists more generally.[1]


Bacharach, M. 2006. Beyond Individual Choice. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Gilbert, M. 2006. A Theory of Political Obligation. New York: Oxford University Press.

Hakli, R., Miller, K., and Tuomela, R. 2010. "Two Kinds of We-Reasoning". Economics and Philosophy 26: 291-320.

Tuomela, R. 2007. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View. New York: Oxford University Press (paperback edition 2010).

Tuomela, R. 2011. Social Ontology: Collective Intentionality and Group Agents (working title), book manuscript.

[1] I wish to thank Matti Heinonen and Maj Tuomela for comments.