Group Duties: Their Existence and Implications for Individuals

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Stephanie Collins, Group Duties: Their Existence and Implications for Individuals, Oxford University Press, 2019, 218pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198840275.

Reviewed by Megs S. Gendreau, Centre College


As Stephanie Collins notes in the opening lines of her book, we (as philosophers, but also as members of political, civic, religious and other communities) frequently assume that groups can have moral responsibilities. In her extraordinarily in-depth and well-researched exploration of group duties, Collins aims to understand precisely what we mean by such attributions as a means to better understand the nature of groups, but also to think about how membership in a group generates duties for individuals. This is accomplished using a "Tripartite Model" dividing groups into combinations, coalitions, and collectives. Only those groups that are united under both shared goals and a shared decision-making procedure (collectives) can properly be said to have such duties. In any other circumstance, duties do not actually exist at the group level and should be more accurately understood as the addition of individual duties. The upshot is not to let members of non-collective groups off the hook, but to disambiguate between those duties best understood as applying to individuals and those appropriately attributed to groups.[1]

While Collins's argument focuses on the moral responsibilities of groups insofar as they are aimed at producing particular outcomes (21), and is therefore not organized around epistemic or other concerns, this constraint shouldn't lead us to think that her aims are too modest. As a project, she is interested in offering not simply a compelling ontological analysis of groups, but to show that this fuller understanding will lead to greater success in moral and political decision-making. Flexibility with respect to the basis of moral judgments and the principles that ground duties, in conjunction with a model that aims to accommodate all forms of human groups, gives Collins the ability to clarify to whom, and under what conditions, it is appropriate for us to direct requests for help or attributions of responsibility. Thus, she claims, we can "plug in" a first order "moral theory and some facts about the groups . . . and the Tripartite Model will spit out an abundance of coordination duties, collectives' duties, and membership duties" (26).

I will begin, as Collins does, with an overview of her Tripartite Schema of collectives, coalitions, and combinations. Each is defined by the relationship between its members, how those members understand themselves qua the larger group, and how group-level decisions are made. Collectives involve agents who are "united under a rationally operated group-level decision-making procedure" that can respond to moral concerns (4). Examples of collectives are entities with very clearly defined structures of decision-making like nation states, but also groups of friends who have shared aims like deciding on a weekend outing. Collectives are uniquely constituted such that they can possess duties arising from a shared decision-making procedure. Such a procedure must be distinct from that used by individual participants and capable of leading to a shift in outcomes or rethinking of internal structures.

Coalitions involve individual agents who have the same goal and an interest in working together to achieve it, but are distinct from collectives as they lack "a group-level decision-making procedure" (4). This might include the group constituted by everyone throughout the world who is interested in reducing greenhouse gas emissions. While there is a shared outcome at which all members of this coalition might aim, and a belief that others with the same goal will be willing to work together to achieve it, the absence of a shared decision-making procedure entails that there is no avenue for determining how best to achieve the desired outcome or through which members can distribute responsibilities or roles. For this reason, members of coalitions may have duties (that can be aggregated), but the group, as an entity, does not.

Finally, combinations include all groups that fail to meet the organizational standards required for consideration as a coalition or a collective, like the group of people walking down a street at a particular moment.[2] Such groups lack a clear goal or structure via which they might aim at achieving such a goal. As with coalitions, one's membership in a collective does not entail any duty, as none of the features required for generating duties are present. In Chapter 5, Collins takes pains to show that combinations are meaningfully distinct from coalitions, as coalitions possess a shared goal making them able to engage in "we-reasoning" such that members see their options as framed by the group and its desired outcome. For this reason, members of combinations are not required to understand their actions or interests as responsive to those of the persons around them.

The primary example used throughout the text involves a responsibility to save a person drowning at the beach, and exploring her usage of this example can provide some clarity. Clearly, the end at which we should aim is that the person be saved, but different groups will frame that outcome, and how best to achieve it, in different ways. When a collective group is confronted by such a situation, the individual agent's duties with respect to the drowning person will be determined by the decision-making structure of the whole and her particular role within that group. For example, someone who is a particularly poor swimmer might be given the responsibility of calling for emergency services instead of assisting in pulling the person from the water. On the other hand, members of combinations and coalitions may still have duties with respect to helping the drowning person, but such obligations arise from their individual situations and not from membership in a group. This is based on her "Coordination Principle", which tells us that, when no other group is better able to meet a moral demand,[3] members of non-collective groups have "a duty to be responsive to the others with a view to the outcome being produced or to the collective being formed" (97). For both combinations and collectives, the expectation of an agent's responsiveness relates to the objective conditions (in this case, the drowning person), and not to some feature of the group in which she finds herself.

While Collins's approach makes it the case that, by definition, the only groups that can be properly said to possess duties are collectives, we needn't take her approach as deflationary, as there are still numerous duties that persons possess when they are members of other groups (even if these are not "group duties"). In particular, coordination duties exist for members of both coalitions and combinations, requiring that individual agents be responsive not merely to "external" conditions, but also to the other members of the group (regardless of whether or not they ultimately work together to form a collective). Far from narrowing the scope of duties, this generates a considerable responsibility to be attentive to the world outside oneself and figure out how best to work with others to achieve objectively good outcomes (even if there are no structures in place to antecedently determine how such deliberation might occur).

I will devote the remainder of my discussion to the sections on the duties of collectives, as this is where Collins's most controversial claims appear. Since the aim is to describe those groups capable of possessing duties, it is necessary that collective groups (in addition to possessing a shared goal and shared decision-making procedures) must be responsive to moral concerns, as without such a constraint they would be unable even to conceive of duties. Despite this restriction, the conception of what groups can be considered collectives is quite expansive as it allows for "minimal collectives" where "at least one member has the capacity to use their role within the group to attend to moral considerations" (162). This entails that non-democratic associations of persons, like aristocratic or dictatorial regimes, would capable of generating group duties for members. The category of collective is further subject to the restriction that members are "committed to the procedure" and are capable of providing inputs to that procedure "at least in the minimal sense that they could leave if they wanted to", even if the "decision-making procedure is housed in the leader's head" (166). Further, in cases where there is a singular leader, this person must be engaged in thinking about what to do in her role as a leader and not in the service of her individual interests.

Collins's approach in this section is partially a response to the account of group agency described by Christian List and Philip Pettit (2011), which assumes an aggregative approach such that no single individual could bear the full burden of choosing without compromising the agency of the collective. While her requirements clearly restrict the forms of non-democratic regimes that can be characterized as collectives (and therefore generate group duties), I worry about a minimum standard of group agency such that participants are "committed to the procedure" and could "leave if they wanted to". Part of my hesitance stems from the fact that despite the overall carefulness of the view, there is vagueness about the floor for commitment to a group's decision-making procedure and what kind of information individual members must have at their disposal in order to be "committed" to the decision-making procedure. This leaves a concern about how much one must know about the procedure in order to assent to it. For example, imagine a leader who truly governs qua group (and not in her own self-interest), but does so utilizing a procedure that isn't actually aimed at this outcome (say, rolling dice). If I know that this is the procedure and choose to remain a member of the group, I seem to be in a very different position than one where all I knew was that the leader was (truly) making decisions with the group in mind. If I were ignorant of the minutiae of the procedure, but would withdraw my membership if I had such knowledge, any duties that arise from my membership in such a group seem, at the very least, suspect. Clearly, Collins has taken pains to ensure that members of collectives ought not be forced to remain in such groups against their will, but I am left with some questions about the epistemic conditions for assent to group membership.

However, the fact that I've picked up on such a concern is an indicator of the care with which the whole of the text was composed and the attention to a detailed analysis of the three categories and implications of membership in those categories. While the only groups which may be properly considered to have duties are those described as collectives, the implications of the theory for non-collectives and their members are still significant. Ultimately, Collins believes that the responsibilities incumbent upon us as members of groups are extensive and really significant. We can't all have duties by virtue of our shared membership in the human race, but we can be said to have duties with respect to morally significant aims and may even be reasonably expected to work with others to meet those goals. Such a result certainly doesn't relieve any person of responsibility for their own role in the world.


List, Christian and Philip Pettit. 2011. Group Agency: The Possibility, Design, and Status of Corporate Agents. Oxford, UK, Oxford University Press.

[1] Although not strictly relevant to the subject of a book review, it seems important to note the care with which Collins thanks her many interlocuters along the way. We might all be able to learn something from Collins's generous acknowledgment of all the formative conversations had in the process of writing a monograph.

[2] Thereby making the Tripartite Model, by definition, exhaustive of all groups.

[3] Operating in the background is a deep commitment to the objective nature of the duties under consideration, despite Collins's commitment to agnosticism regarding first order normative theories.