Group Rationality in Scientific Research

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Husain Sarkar, Group Rationality in Scientific Research, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 284pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521871136.

Reviewed by Katie Steele, University of Sydney


In the preface to this book, Husain Sarkar states the central problem of the book in very general terms: "Under what conditions is a group of scientists rational?" The first part of the book is spent warming up to a more concrete statement of this problem, giving the reader a sense of how it fits with other investigations of "group rationality". Indeed, in chapters 2 and 3 Sarkar canvasses two prominent models of reasoning in groups -- game theory and social choice theory -- to determine if there are any obvious leads in this literature for tackling his own problem of group rationality in science. Sarkar concludes that his problem is "unique", and towards the end of chapter 3 (p. 67), he rephrases the key question in these terms:

what ought to be the structure of a society of scientists -- the structure defined in terms of method -- at a given time, or over an interval of time, in virtue of which that structure would best enable that society of scientists to reach its goals better than it would under any other structure?

The bulk of the book (chapters 4-7) is taken up by an appraisal of what Sarkar refers to as the "classical solutions" to the problem of how science should be done, from Feyerabend's "skepticism" through Kitcher and Kuhn (not chronologically) to Popper's "falsificationist" method and Lakatos's notion of "research programs". Chapter 8 deals with some ideas of Hilary Putnam. In his quest to refashion the work of these authors so that they answer the question stated above, Sarkar reveals just how ambitious his project really is. The unfinished nature of the task is well highlighted in the conclusion in chapter 9, when Sarkar revisits the range of issues that have an impact on the question of group rationality in science.

Sarkar's project is novel in its scope. As he himself points out in several places (e.g., preface, p. 68), the "classical solutions" to the problem of group rationality in science that are analysed in chapters 4-7 were not in fact pitched by their authors as solutions to Sarkar's overarching normative problem. With the exception of Feyerabend's skeptical view, these were answers to more modest and localised questions: e.g., When should a particular research program, or even a particular theory, be abandoned? In fact, one might argue that some of the views addressed in chapters 4-7 were not even intended to be purely normative. For instance, we might regard Kuhn as to some extent describing, rather than prescribing, what is the normal and accepted course of scientific progress. Lakatos's discussion of research programs could also be interpreted in this way. Sarkar thus reconfigures these views; he considers how they fare as responses to his broader normative question of how scientific endeavour as a whole should be structured. Not surprisingly, none of the so-called classical views makes for a full response to this question. But in aiming for a global account, Sarkar draws attention to the various, and not necessarily competing, angles that have been pursued with respect to acceptable scientific practice.

Scattered throughout the book are many astute distinctions that serve to refine the key research question. For example, Sarkar emphasises that his interest is to determine a scientific structure that best services the shared or group aims of scientists, rather than some aggregation of their individual aims. In his discussion of the skeptical view in chapter 4, Sarkar makes an important distinction between the possibilities for establishing the correct aim(s) of science and whether we can assess what method(s) is (are) most conducive to said aim(s). Chapter 6 introduces the question of whether there is a difference between static and dynamic assessments of scientific performance. Later chapters ask whether we should define scientific structure in terms of the theories pursued, the methods pursued, or some other more basic institutions. Indeed, the refinements to the problem of group rationality in science multiply throughout the book. While this certainly demonstrates the complexity of the problem, even the careful reader may find it difficult to keep track of the various threads. Sarkar presents his investigations as an intellectual journey rather than as a carefully knitted finished product, and while there are advantages to this approach, there are also some disadvantages. Arguably, some points appearing later in the book would be more profitably made upfront. For instance, towards the end of chapter 7 Sarkar highlights that determining the ideal structure of scientific society does not imply that this structure should be instituted in any particular way; so we need not fear that the problem is one of determining some kind of science dictatorship. Since readers might have been confused about this issue, it would have made sense to clarify it in the introduction.

So much for a general overview of the book. I want to now focus on the two main aspects of Sarkar's approach to the problem of group rationality in science: he seeks the best structure for achieving the shared goal(s) of scientists. The approach is normative through and through; the shared goals of scientists are not taken to be those goals they all happen to have, but rather those goals the scientific community should have. In other words, the aim of science is perceived from an impersonal and objective standpoint. Sarkar claims that this aim is simply to discover as many truths as possible (and reject falsehoods). He notes that this is a rather unsophisticated view of the goal of science, but thinks it sufficient for his purposes. (And he does acknowledge complications, like the realist/antirealist disagreement about the claims of scientific theories (pp. 246-7).) The many questions that are left unanswered in later chapters indicate, however, that Sarkar will need to develop a more sophisticated account of the goal of science if he wants to make further progress, beyond the present book, on the problem of how to best organise scientific society. In any case, given that scientific success is assumed to be both defined and measured according to an objective standard, it is not surprising that in chapter 3 Sarkar finds little similarity between his own problem and Sen's problem of social welfare. Sen's task is to assess various social structures in terms of social welfare. Sarkar wants to assess scientific structures in terms of what we might call scientific welfare. But in Sen's case, it is the determination of social welfare that is the problem -- given assessments of individual welfare, how should we compute the overall welfare for the various social arrangements? There is no such problem in Sarkar's case because scientific welfare does not depend on any kind of aggregation of individual states/opinions. Scientific welfare is understood as directly related to the number of truths that are discovered.

Given that Sarkar stipulates a shared objective goal for scientific society, it is interesting that he nonetheless carves up the "classical solutions" into the categories of skeptical, subjective and objective. It is not entirely clear why these accounts warrant the names Sarkar gives to them. Moreover, some of his criticisms of these views, particularly that of Kitcher in chapter 5, are rather puzzling. The view is presumably labelled "subjective" because it gives prominence to the personal motivations of scientists. Sarkar presents Kitcher as endorsing the idea that individual scientists' pursuit of personal goals in science is always the best way to achieve the group goal of truth. But this does not seem to be a fair representation of Kitcher's work. In fact, it appears that Kitcher more or less sidesteps Sarkar's normative problem -- he simply begins with the assumption that there will be some objectively best division of cognitive labour (in the form of number of scientists per theory) that is evident to all scientists. Kitcher's interest is whether scientists might happen to fall into the ideal division of labour, given varying assumptions about the interaction of scientists and how personal incentives in science operate. This is in the vein of the game theory approach that Sarkar discusses in chapter 2. Sarkar emphasises that game theory models cannot answer to his principal problem of how scientific society ought to be structured. He recognises that game models serve a rather different purpose -- they can be useful for the descriptive task of exploring what conditions must hold at the individual level for a targeted group structure to spontaneously arise/evolve. If Sarkar were to characterise Kitcher's project in this way, then perhaps he would not be so opposed to the claims that Kitcher makes. Indeed, it does not seem reasonable to criticise a model on normative grounds if the model was only intended for descriptive purposes, i.e., to illuminate what is or might be the case if certain assumptions hold.

It is no doubt fairer to say that Sarkar objects to Kitcher's simplistic assumptions with regard to individual motivations and the ideal structure of scientific society. Indeed, Sarkar asks, "… what is the proper subject of group rationality?" (p. 131). He continues, "Kitcher takes it to be the particular scientific theories; I take it to be the methodology". This issue of what sorts of structural arrangements for scientific society we should be trying to assess could well be regarded as the main focus of the book. It is certainly the focus of the later chapters (7-9). While Sarkar seeks something beyond a mere distribution of cognitive labour over theories, he (quite fittingly) has trouble pinning down what a more comprehensive "methodology" actually looks like. Chapter 7 considers some candidates -- we have Popper's falsificationist approach, which advises scientists to simply go about falsifying and thus eliminating theories. Then there is Lakatos's more sophisticated account that appeals to research programs; the idea is that "core" theories are retained so long as the "auxiliary" theories that preserve empirical fit do not become too cumbersome. If we are interested in the overall structure of scientific society, however, surely there is still the question of how many research programs should be pursued, and by how many scientists. Furthermore, there are additional complications to the issue of what constitutes a scientific methodology. In chapter 8 Sarkar discusses the relationship between the structure of scientific society and the broader social structure. For instance, should democratic rights like freedom of speech and equality of opportunity be up for consideration in the quest for an ideal scientific structure, or are these rather basic social conditions that any viable scientific society should satisfy?

So the book ends on a speculative note (a lead up to the next volume). For starters, we are left with the problem of determining just what is entailed by the "structure" of a scientific society. A more developed account of what it is that this structure is supposed to achieve -- the objective goal of science -- would presumably help at this point. Sarkar in fact gestures towards a rather grand view with respect to structure. He is clearly open to the pursuit of multiple scientific methods. And then in the final chapter, he goes on to suggest defining scientific structure in terms of even more basic scientific institutions. Here Sarkar seeks inspiration from Rawls' veil of ignorance and the choice of institutions for a just society. While such analogies are certainly very seductive, it would seem that Sarkar is better to stick to a more modest depiction of the problem of group rationality in science. The "new problem of demarcation" (pp. 195-200) -- distinguishing and evaluating scientific methods -- is arguably a more tangible place to start than determining what should be the knowledge state of scientists in the "original position".