Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotion

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Jesse J. Prinz, Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotion, Oxford University Press, 2004, 288pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195151453.

Reviewed by Craig DeLancey, State University of New York at Oswego


Gut Reactions is a valuable, and in several ways novel, contribution to the current literature on the philosophy of emotion. Prinz stakes out a position that has recently been revised by some scientists but has long been out of favor with philosophers: the "James-Lange view" that emotions are perceptions of body states. Prinz also defends the view that emotions represent a natural kind. In recent years, only cognitivist theories of emotions (those theories that posit that emotions are in part constituted by, or otherwise require, cognitive states) have been unified accounts. Those who reject cognitivism have tended also to reject the notion that there is a natural kind for the states we call "emotions." Prinz cuts across these positions, rejecting cognitivism about emotions but arguing for a highly unified account of emotions and other affects.

Prinz begins by assessing the cognitivism debate. The concept of "cognition" is a sore point in the philosophy of emotion, since there is no consensus and almost no clarity about what it might best mean. Prinz offers a view as good as any and better than most. He argues that "cognitions are states containing representations that are under [direct] organismic control" (49). This sounds about the same as the view that cognitions are products of the will; but though organismic control or the will is itself mysterious, it is possible to see how one might go about looking for evidence that a state was answerable to the will. One can test if a subject can change the state, for example. Furthermore, Prinz goes so far as to brave a hypothesis about the brain areas that may be required for direct control: "I propose that we call a state cognitive just in case it includes representations that are under the control of structures in executive systems, which, in mammals, are found in the prefrontal cortex" (47). With this working notion, Prinz concludes that emotions are not cognitive.

Instead, emotions are perceptions of certain kinds of body states. These body states are ones that reliably track certain kinds of conditions in the environment of the agent. For example, one kind of body state reliably is caused by potential dangers in the environment. An instance of fear is a perception of an instance of this kind of body state. But because the body state perceived is reliably linked with dangers, it is appropriate to say that fear represents potential dangers in the environment. To make this distinction, Prinz introduces the terminology of nominal and real contents, so that the nominal content of the emotion as a representation is the body state, but the real content is the environmental condition that reliably causes the state -- in this case, dangers.

To clarify this point, Prinz uses Anthony Kenny's idea of a formal object. Roughly, the formal object of an emotion is the real and abstracted content of it. Prinz identifies these as core relational themes. The notion of core relational themes is taken from the psychologist Richard Lazarus, who offered a highly intuitive taxonomy of such themes for emotions. For example, Lazarus identifies "a demeaning offense against me and mine" for anger and "facing an immediate, concrete, and overwhelming physical danger" for fright. Prinz suggests that the core relational themes of emotions outlined by Lazarus present a highly plausible list of formal objects. This is a convincing move on Prinz's part: to argue that Lazarus's taxonomy of core relational themes describes not the structure of emotions (as he argues Lazarus claims) but rather the content of these emotions.

Prinz has no compelling evidence that emotions are embodied appraisals. His direct defense of the claim includes reviving the long-disputed arguments of William James and Karl Lange, and reviewing the conflicting evidence regarding emotion intensity among subjects with spinal injury. However, with no clear evidence ruling against the James-Lange theory, Prinz's fecund use of the theory is its best and most compelling defense. He demonstrates this fecundity elegantly through the remainder of the book. He argues that embodied appraisals are a natural kind, since "all emotions are embodied appraisals under the causal control of" a mechanism that links various judgments with those embodied appraisals. He seeks a compromise between nativism and social constructionism by arguing that his theory can allow for a range of different kinds of perceived body states, from universal "innate" ones to culturally specific learned ones, to count as emotions; this is possible because we can learn to associate new contents with kinds of body states, there can be cognitive-emotion hybrids, and there can be blends of basic emotions. He extends his account to offer explanations of moods and other affects. Finally, he proposes a theory of emotional consciousness on the model of perceptual consciousness.

In these later sections, Prinz also defends the view that emotions have either negative or positive valence. This is a popular view in psychology and philosophy, but one that has little evidence, and which may be a detriment to research by forcing simplistic interpretations of some behaviors. Prinz cites as support for a bivalent view some analyses of subject reports of emotion similarity, which can be interpreted as showing two groupings. But he admits that the neuropsychological evidence provides no evidence for grouping emotions as negative and positive. He suggests this could be because "negative and positive valence supervene on complex networks that implicate a large number of brain areas" (163). One might better reject the fallible contingencies of language use over the findings of fMRIs and PET studies, but Prinz expands his notion of emotions to argue that "emotions seem to contain two distinctive parts. Every emotion has a valence, which it shares with other emotions. But every emotion also has a distinctive bodily profile reflected by (sometimes subtle) differences in neuronal activity" (163). One reason Prinz takes this approach is that on his theory appraisals do not motivate, but valence does. However, the notion that emotions fall into negative and positive valence is a claim we can drop while still retaining the rest of Prinz's theory. There would be little loss in explaining motivation in some other way, or even leaving motivation as a primitive for future explanation.

Prinz's account is least compelling when we consider emotional actions (actions caused by or best explained by emotions). Prinz makes quick work of rejecting the view that emotions are action states or are essentially related to actions. But this has at least three problems.

First, we may not be able to specify formal objects without reference to kinds of action. Prinz assumes formal objects of emotions can be specified without reference to the behaviors that we usually associate with the relevant emotions. That is, fear (he claims) has as a formal object danger. This formal object must be something we can specify without any reference to flight, since the action is contingent though the formal object is not. But it is reasonable to doubt that there is a formal object of fear, anger, and any other basic emotion other than that there are things that it is appropriate to flee, that is appropriate to attack, and so on. This would be evident if we discovered that people may find it beneficial to be afraid of things that are not reasonably interpreted as dangerous, or to lack fear for things that are reasonably interpreted as dangerous.

Second, Prinz ends up committed to the view that an emotion is necessarily a perception of a preparation for a specific kind of action, but that kind of action is itself unnecessary and a "choice." If an emotion like fear is an embodied appraisal, and thus is our perception of a body state, this perception of this kind of body state (and not just any other body state) is fear in part because the body state is reliably and recognizably similar in its occurrences. The reason there is a body state that forms a kind, Prinz argues, is that this body state has a purpose; for example, fear changes our body in ways that prepare it for flight. But flight itself is not essential to fear. For Prinz, emotions "instigate the search for appropriate actions" (228) but do not directly cause actions and most definitely are not composed of action programs of any kind. But why would fear typically lead to flight, and not always to a different action, if flight were just an option that is searched for among other options? And why would the body reliably prepare for the flight in face of dangers, if flight were one contingent possibility among others? Similarly: "The decision to seek revenge is a choice that follows anger," Prinz claims (194). Given Prinz's notion of cognition as will or organismic control, this makes emotional action cognitive. If we weaken his notion of "choice" in this passage to be other than organismic control, we need to know what this other choice system is. It would seem that Prinz is committed to the position that flight is the most common best response to danger, and so the most common appropriate choice; and thus the body has evolved structures that cause it to prepare for flight when confronted with danger; but the emotion itself does nothing to ensure or encourage flight.

This leads to a third difficulty. We frequently use emotions to explain kinds of actions that are not well explained in terms of the kinds of goals that we presumably would use to guide a choice. Such cases include post-functional actions. A person who is afraid may flee farther than he knows is necessary. Suppose that the following is a common kind of occurrence: a man fears snakes, knows the snake before him can move only slowly and only over short distances, but he flees a good ten meters from the snake. We explain this kind of behavior by saying the man was very afraid: if fear was in part composed of the motivation to flee, we can explain the flight beyond the satisfaction of any chosen goal because the flight motivation is itself active. But if flight is a choice that we make when afraid, fleeing too far from a dangerous thing seems an irrational and yet strangely common behavior. Similar kinds of actions can be identified for all the basic emotions (e.g., attacking with violence that exceeds that required to undo an offense). A related problem arises for the notion that emotions act as a commitment mechanism, a view proposed by Robert Frank and endorsed by Prinz (83ff). On this view, emotions override cognitive means-end reasoning to ensure certain kinds of commitments. Prinz argues that by adopting a noncognitive view of emotions he enables such a commitment mechanism; but if it turns out that the particular action taken is a choice, then the commitment can be undone between the emotion and the act. Prinz will need to explain how such choices are independent of means-end reasoning in a way that maintains commitment. It is far more parsimonious to propose some essential link between flight and fear, attack and anger, and so on: this can explain the formal objects of these basic emotions, their bodily changes, and the consequent emotional actions.

However, these are the observations of a partisan in the current emotion debate. Prinz's book provides a valuable perspective on the emotions by offering a compelling and surprisingly fecund defense of a view neglected in recent philosophy. Given the tendency of much recent research on the philosophy of emotions to revisit ad nauseum the same few debates with the same few responses, Prinz's book offers an exciting and refreshing new course. Gut Reactions should spawn needed debate about the views he offers, and may act as the locus in philosophy for a rebirth of the James-Lange theory.