Habermas and Pragmatism

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Aboulafia, Mitchell, Myra Bookman, and Catherine Kemp (eds.), Habermas and Pragmatism, Routledge, 2002, 256pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 041523459X.

Reviewed by Christopher F. Zurn, University of Kentucky


This volume is a well-conceived and important new addition to the secondary literature on the wide-ranging philosophical work of Jürgen Habermas. It comprises ten essays relating aspects of his theoretical corpus to themes, claims, and arguments encountered in the work of both classical and contemporary pragmatists. While three of the essays are updated versions of previously published work (those by Karl-Otto Apel, Cristina Lafont, and Richard Shusterman), seven of the essays are unique to the volume (those by Myra Bookman, David Ingram, Lenore Langsdorf, Joseph Margolis, Frank I. Michelman, Tom Rockmore, and Sandra B. Rosenthal). Additionally the volume has an introduction by Mitchell Aboulafia that presents a summary outline of the critical perspectives of the contributors and a clear overview of some points of convergence and divergence between Habermas and pragmatism concerning a broad variety of themes in epistemology, ontology, meta-philosophy, philosophy of language, moral theory, political theory, social theory, legal theory, philosophical anthropology, and aesthetics. The volume is capped by the short three-part “Postscript: Some Concluding Remarks” by Habermas, consisting of, first, a “Response” that acknowledges his debt to the contributors and briefly responds to specific criticisms presented in the volume by Apel and Michelman, second “Reflections on Pragmatism” in the form of responses to six questions posed by Aboulafia to Habermas concerning his relationship to the work of the American pragmatists, and third a short, previously untranslated Die Zeit piece from 1998 “On John Dewey’s Quest for Certainty.

In this “Postscript,” Aboulafia receives Habermas’s pithiest response to the question “What are the greatest strengths of pragmatism?”: “The combination of fallibilism with anti-skepticism, and a naturalist approach to the human mind and its culture that refuses to yield to any kind of scientism” (p. 228). Of course, we can read this claim not only as a relatively dispassionate assessment of the history of philosophical movements, but also as a self-attribution of what Habermas himself hopes to have achieved in his work by drawing on specific pragmatist insights and philosophical strategies.

Stylizing somewhat, we might even speculate that Habermas aims for a measure of anti-skeptical fallibilism in his methodological and epistemological projects by drawing on C. S. Peirce’s attempt to save the cognitive content of the Kantian ideas of reason without recourse, however, to a metaphysical appeal to the noumenal realm. Perhaps he hopes to have achieved an anti-scientistic—let us say, anti-reductivist—but nevertheless naturalistic theory of human culture and subjectivity by drawing on G. H. Mead’s account of human ontogenesis and phylogenesis in terms of universal structures developed through intersubjective symbolic interaction. The strategy that Habermas shares with Peirce is two-fold: on the one hand, an empirical, hence fallibilistic, appeal to the unavoidable presuppositions built into the everyday use of language, and, on the other hand, an idealizing, hence anti-skeptical, appeal to the meaning of epistemic presuppositions in terms of an asymptotic progress towards truth and objectivity as achieved by an unlimited community of problem-solving interlocutors. The strategy that Habermas shares with Mead is also two-fold: on the one-hand, an appeal to the best contemporary naturalistic accounts of individual and socio-cultural development in terms of the irreducibly intersubjective structures of language use, without, on the other hand, supposing that one could simply ignore the normativity of such developmental structures through a positivistic reduction of the problems of the social sciences and philosophy to the results of the so-called ’hard’ sciences and thereby sidestep the difficult hermeneutic issues raised by the linguistic milieu of the structures.

Of course, realizing such aspirations towards an anti-skeptical fallibilism and an anti-reductivist naturalism involves one in a sort of philosophical high-wire act, finding just the right path between the dead-ends of dogmatism and skepticism, between over-confident rationalism and a dismissal of philosophy as passé. This volume attests to both the interest and the precariousness of that balance through a compelling series of essays which add weight to one or another side in their respective attempts to show the unsustainable character of Habermas’s theoretical equilibrium.

Contemporary English-language philosophers who sail under the banner of pragmatism are, of course, somewhat more skeptical than Habermas about the possibilities for any non-metaphysical, naturalistic, and fully fallibilistic account—no matter how ’detranscendentalized’—of Kantian and post-Kantian ideas of reason such as unconditional truth, objectivity, rational accountability, freedom, normativity, linguistic universals, context-transcendent justification, and so on. Readers sympathetic to these more skeptical strains would do well to start with Rockmore’s “The Epistemological Promise of Pragmatism.” In this essay he gives a clear definition of classical pragmatism’s common core features:

These include a rejection of Cartesianism, more precisely an effort to stake out a meaningful view of knowledge after foundationalism; a concern with the practice as distinguished from the theory of knowledge; a disdain for absolute claims, such as apodicticity; a stress on future results, or consequences; a concern with a collaborative approach to knowledge, hence the abandonment of the monological approach to the cognitive subject; and an understanding of the subject as real, finite human beings [sic]. (page 49)

Rockmore then canvasses some of the positions defended by Apel, Habermas, and Richard Rorty in an attempt to show that all three are overtly or covertly foundationalists, too much under the spell of Cartesian philosophical ambitions. Furthermore, he claims that each embraces a form of the consensus theory of truth that systematically conflates what is true with what can be justified. He then holds out the hope for a constructive philosophical epistemology in the wake of the skeptical recognition that there can be no access to truth independently of our mental constructions of the world, though there is little detail given here about what this might be, aside from the notion that “we have knowledge based on intersubjective agreement, but not truth” (page 57). Unfortunately for a volume on Habermas and pragmatism, Rockmore gives no serious attention to the extensive changes in both Habermas’s reading of Peirce since his 1968 book Knowledge and Human Interests and his views on truth, knowledge, and justification since his 1973 article “Wahrheitstheorien.” Habermas has made many significant modifications to his considered views on epistemology during the intervening three decades, many of which were already evident in the English language collection of his essays from the period On the Pragmatics of Communication (1998). For those interested in epistemological and metaphysical themes, the extremely important “Introduction: Realism after the Linguistic Turn” from Habermas’s Truth and Justification (2003) is now the unavoidable text, even as they will find much of interest in other essays in the volume. It’s a shame that the publishing order of Habermas and Pragmatism and Truth and Justification were not reversed.

If Rockmore is skeptical about the crypto-foundationalist ambitions he detects in Habermas’s attempt to save the cognitive content of our everyday notions of truth, objectivity, and rationality after admitting the fallibility of any and all philosophical claims, Apel charges Habermas with being unable to stave off such skepticism without the requisite infallibility promised by transcendental foundationalism. Apel’s essay “Regarding the Relationship of Morality, Law and Democracy: on Habermas’s Philosophy of Law (1992) from a Transcendental-Pragmatic Point of View” provides one of the clearest and most succinct statements of the basic meta-philosophical differences between Apel’s foundationalist understanding of a formal-pragmatics of language and Habermas’s more fallibilistic and deflationary understanding of formal pragmatics. Although Apel and Habermas developed much of their respective work in close concert, Apel rightly identifies the crucial disagreement between them as concerning the status of the communicative presuppositions concerning truth, moral rightness, sincerity, and consensus that both take to be pragmatically unavoidable. While for Habermas statements about these presuppositions “are considered to be empirically testable and thus fallible,” (p. 19) Apel claims that this position “entails a step into the nonsensical” (p. 19) as they “cannot be fallible and subject to empirical tests, because in the case of falsification they would simultaneously be presupposed in their transcendental function” (p. 19). Given this meta-philosophical difference, it should come as no surprise that Apel believes Habermas’s understanding of practical philosophy—including moral theory, political theory, and legal theory—centered as it is in the fallible reconstruction of the results of the social sciences, is subject to skeptical worries and internal confusions which would be alleviated by Apel’s program for transcendental foundationalism. I cannot do justice here to the very important issues Apel raises about the architectonics of Habermas’s theories of morality, legality, and democracy, but anyone interested in these topics will need to come to terms with the powerful, sympathetic critiques presented here by Apel.

If Rockmore and Apel point to the precariousness of Habermas’s Peirce-inspired balance between fallibilism and skepticism with respect to epistemology and philosophy itself, many of the remaining essays evince the precariousness of his Mead-inspired balance between naturalism and scientistic reductivism with respect to the semantic content of human cultures and subjectivity. Michelman, in “The Problem of Constitutional Interpretive Disagreement: Can ’Discourses of Application’ Help?” claims that Habermas’s strategy for justifying basic constitutional norms in modern, ethically pluralistic societies does not work. His argument begins by extending John Rawls’s conception of intractable but reasonable disagreement to include intractable differences over the proper application of abstract constitutional norms—such as due process or religious freedom—to specific controversies—such as affirmative action or public financing for sectarian schools. Labeling this “reasonable interpretive pluralism,” Michelman then points to the pragmatist insight that there is a reciprocal, mutually-determinative relationship between the meaning of abstract generalities and the concrete cases they are taken to cover: not only do changes in the meaning of the abstract norm change the set of cases it is taken to cover, but changes in the set of appropriately applied cases also change the meaning of the abstract norm. If this is so, Michelman contends, then there can be no hope for a consensus on more abstract constitutional norms under conditions of intractable but reasonable disagreement about concrete policies. But this hope for an abstract consensus above concrete dissensus is at the heart of the attempt by contractarians like Habermas, Charles Larmore, and Rawls to justify democratic processes through reasoned agreement on constitutional essentials, even under conditions of value pluralism. For Michelman, a truly naturalist assessment of the depth of reasonable disagreement, combined with a pragmatist’s attention to linguistic meaning in use, would show that Habermas’s hopes for detecting universal structures of political intersubjectivity across interpretive differences are overly-idealistic.

At the other end of the balance, Ingram’s “The Sirens of Pragmatism versus the Priests of Proceduralism: Habermas and American Legal Realism” attempts to show that Habermas should not have so quickly dismissed the jurisprudential insights of early American legal realists. Ingram and Habermas agree that many legal realists espoused an ostensibly value-free, technocratic approach to ’scientific’ judicial policy-making, one inspired by the reductivist idea that normative ideals of political morality are nothing more than private emotive preferences. But in an insightful periodization of American legal realists, Ingram shows that such views were not characteristic of earlier, progressive legal realists. While both earlier and later theorists share a critique of legal formalism rooted in attention to real-world legal indeterminacy and the role of background assumptions and legal paradigms in deciding actual cases, the earlier realists advocated a jurisprudence guided by ideals and critical insight, one attentive to complex considerations of legal texts, precedents, and the interests and perspectives of affected parties. Ingram canvasses a number of themes raised by the progressive realists which might prove fruitful for further research that would extend basically pragmatist insights into Habermas’s discursive theory of legal adjudication, without however succumbing to a scientistic evisceration of the cognitive content of normative political and legal ideals.

In “Is Objectivity Perspectival? Reflections on Brandom’s and Habermas’s Pragmatist Conceptions of Objectivity,” Lafont argues that the meaning of concepts centered around the external world cannot be fully translated into a social-scientific language that refers to the social practice from a third-person, observer’s perspective. In her argument against Robert Brandom’s attempt to translate common-sense realist presuppositions into the reciprocal structures evinced in social practices of mutual attribution, Lafont intends to warn against the reductivist tendencies of a social science that ignores the methodological irreducibility of the participant’s perspective. If I am not mistaken, Lafont believes that Habermas’s conceptions of objectivity and knowledge cannot avoid reference to at least some minimal notion of a reality independent of social practices, at least if he intends to take seriously the everyday presupposition “speakers share that there is a difference between what is objectively correct and what is merely taken to be so” (p. 190). In this sense, she intends to warn Habermas of the reductivist dangers of an overly-naturalized account of truth in terms of social practices of assertion.

Shusterman’s “Habermas, Pragmatism, and the Problem of Aesthetics” presents an interesting and insightful account of Habermas’s views on modernity, the postmodern, reason, language, and aesthetics by comparing them with those of Rorty. He rightly points out that, in fact, Habermas and Rorty agree on quite a bit with respect to art and aesthetics: both celebrate innovative, controlled modernist art as offering certain potentials for melioration and transformation; both abhor the anarchic aesthetic of uncontrolled Dionysianism; and both tend to overgeneralize the linguistic character of human nature and the lifeworld. Shusterman claims that their relatively minor disagreements mainly concern whether to privilege the rational or the aesthetic component of language use, and that this disagreement leads to meta-philosophical differences, with Habermas aligning philosophy with the social sciences and Rorty aligning it with literature. Finally, Shusterman raises a worry about a kind of crypto-scientism in Habermas’s theory of communicative action. Here the problem is not, as Habermas would have it, a reduction of the normative content of culture and subjectivity to the explanatory forms of the natural sciences, but rather a reduction of the visceral and sensuous meanings of aesthetic experience to the overly discursive and rational forms of philosophy and the linguistic sciences. Shusterman thus advocates a kind of naturalism true to aesthetic experience—one that would, however, already preclude both scientistic and philosophical-linguistic reductivism. The open question is whether such adequacy to the phenomena of aesthetics leaves any room for theoretical claims beyond the particularistic description of and involvement in artworks.

The remaining four essays in the volume are not as successful either as philosophical treatments of their central topics or as informed and up-to-date readings of Habermas’s work, and may be avoided without loss. Nevertheless, the overall quality of the essays in the volume is high, and it will be an essential reference for those working on Habermas at either a student or professional level. By bringing Habermas’s work into explicit conversation with both historical and contemporary forms of philosophical pragmatism, Aboulafia, Bookman and Kemp have put together a book that will be of service to specialists and those new to the field alike. It should also provoke further debates about the tenability of Habermas’s pragmatist-inspired high-wire act, balancing between fallibilism and skepticism, as well as between naturalism and reductivism.