Habermas and Theology

Placeholder book cover

Nicholas Adams, Habermas and Theology, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 278pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521681146.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, Stony Brook University


Adjoining two nouns in the title of a book is like writing a blank check to "cash." One better know who is receiving the check and one better make sure to have sufficient funds when it gets cashed. This book promises too much, and thus delivers too little, but what it delivers is still worth the trouble. The author manages to say some interesting things that may be of use to both philosophers and theologians, notwithstanding the author's avowed claims and disclaimers. The book is vituperative, contrarian, combative, and irreverent. In many ways and on many occasions, the very assumptions of the book are refuted in its execution. The book is a large performative self-contradiction: the form of the enunciated speech act is contradicted by its enactment. While Adams claims that

My thesis is that Habermas wants the power and the inspiration without danger [of both religion and theology]. I therefore do not treat him as a serious theological partner in dialogue. This is not out of disrespect, but out of a recognition that his theological readers need to reconstruct his arguments and so discover that he is not talking about their religious traditions, but about the (idealized) ancestors of (idealized) modern self-consciousness. (13)

If he is not a "serious theological partner," why write a book entitled "Habermas and Theology"? Indeed, the book manages to demonstrate quite eloquently and insightfully that Habermas is a serious theological partner, challenger, as well as a grateful and respectful appreciator of both religion and theology. Still, the reader should be advised that he or she will have to come across and simply overlook and pass over with patience and tolerance a lot of analogously annoying and disconcerting claims, precisely because the author himself denies them in other parts of the book. I will describe some of these claims, not to damn the book, but to clear the underbrush so as to get to what is indeed useful.

Adams claims that he will only deal in a minimal and very circumscribed way with Habermas' engagements with theologians, and conversely, with the use that theologians have made of Habermas' Werk. He offers two justifications: one, because in his view Herman Düringer's still untranslated Universale Vernunft und partikularer Glaube: eine Theologische Ausweertung des Werkes von Jürgen Habermas (1999) has provided an overview of Habermas' appropriation by theologians; two, because unlike Kant, Hegel, and Wittgenstein, whose works have had "generative theological developments," Habermas has not and will not. Adams in fact claims that in contrast to the aforementioned philosophers, "Habermas has not had this kind of influence on theology, and is unlikely to have it in the future." (15) There are already several hefty volumes on Habermas and religion, theology, and inter-faith dialogues. In addition to the names Adams mentions in his book, and some who are dealt with by Düringer, we should add those of Sharon D. Welch, Edmund Arens, Francis Schlüsser Fiorenza, and Gary M. Simpson -- to cite only a few that immediately come to mind. The young Wolfhart Pannenberg was influenced by Habermas, or at least contended with him as a very serious dialogue partner. What is perhaps most distressing about Adams' claim is that Habermas is still an extremely productive, creative and engaged philosopher. Adams's book was published in 2006, but the bibliography and the contents of the book reveal that he stopped reading or doing research around 2000. The book I edited with Habermas on his religious and theological writings is cited, but not engaged, though it contains a lengthy interview in which Habermas answers directly many of the questions that Adams poses in his text[1]. In the half decade since the bulk of Adams's book was written, Habermas has produced a series of extremely provocative, unique and generative essays on the relationship between religious pluralism and democracies, on the continuing relevance of Kant's philosophy of religion, and on the meaning of religious confessions in the public sphere. And while it is not often that one's claims are so irrevocably refuted by a major event, such was the case when Cardinal Ratzinger and Habermas engaged in a major public debate in Munich[2]. It has been said among Habermas cognoscenti that Habermas has been at work on a major treatise on religion, a communicative theory of religion, if one can hazard such an oddity, the preliminary studies for which have meanwhile appeared in his book Between Naturalism and Religion[3]. And as recently as 2006, Habermas' work was the subject of a several day symposium in Austria, to which Habermas replied with a massive, thorough and provocative essay the size of a small book[4]. This reply alone commands a rethinking of what Habermas has written on religion and theology for the last two decades, since TCA.

In the same vein that Adams forecloses Habermas' possible impact on theology, he also announces "Habermas' debates with theologians are not generative for his own project." (16) This is such a comprehensive and unqualified statement that it almost rings plausible and even defensible. Yet, Adams himself shows in his book that Habermas has engaged theologians for most of his philosophical career, as he has engaged them, with the same energy, solicitude, and patience that he has engaged sociologists, political theorists, Marxists, Heideggerians, Foucauldians, etc, etc. There is one thing that can be said about Habermas without qualification and without fear that one will be contradicted or disproved, and that is that Habermas is a voracious consumer and digester of theory. Already in the late sixties, George Lichtheim noted about Habermas that

[h]e seems to have been born with a faculty for digesting the toughest kind of material and then refashioning it into orderly wholes. Hegel, whom he resembles at least in his appetite for encyclopedic knowledge possessed this capacity in the highest degree, but he was cursed with an abominable style and a perverse fondness for obscurity, whereas Habermas writes as clearly and concisely as any empiricist.[5]

Whatever one may think about Lichtheim's judgments about Hegel's style and perversities, he is surely right about Habermas' style, both in its execution and presentation. And even if it would be quite acceptable to claim that it is difficult to disaggregate Habermas' own work from his interlocutors, one cannot circumvent the responsibility of having to point out that Habermas has answered thoughtfully the challenges of many theologians, answers that have left a trace in his thinking. There are at the very least two very explicit cases in which Habermas' work has been deeply marked by theologians. One is of course Johannes Baptist Metz, with whom Habermas has had a long-term friendship and tense philosophical-theological debate. The other is Gershom Scholem, whose traces in Habermas' work are more difficult to discern, because they are so thoroughly mediated by what Habermas called in 1961 the 'German Idealism of Jewish Philosophers.'[6] And here we are confronted with a loud and inexcusable silence in Adams' book on Habermas and theology, namely that no attention is given to Habermas' engagement with Jewish philosophers and theologians.

Here is another disconcerting claim: "Habermas' defence of universalism is not self-explanatory." (92) This statement opens chapter five in which Habermas' defense of universalism, his rejection of relativism, and the performative self-contradictory position of the postmoderns in particular are covered. But why should any defense be self-explanatory? A defense is itself the justification of a stance, and if there is need for a defense then nothing is already self-explanatory, for then there would be no need for a defense or argumentation. We would just nod and assent and say Ja! And even if universalism were the most beleaguered position, and the least defended in our times, one would still have to argue on its behalf, and we would not take it for self-evident, precisely because it is the least popular and the least easy to be lulled into. Whatever else one may want to say about Habermas' 'perverse fondness' for the inevitable, uncircumventable, and always already presupposed, his staunch, unflinching, unwavering, ever energetic and bright-eyed defense of universalism is surely both admirable in its stoicism and inspirational in its utopian promise. Indeed, Habermas' defense of universalism is not self-explanatory; it is the very essence of his entire work and the work is its very justification and explanation.

One last issue that needs clarification: Adams claims, and this claim provides the leitmotif of the entire work, that Habermas is really not interested in religion qua religion; religion as such only has an aleatory and epiphenomenal character for Habermas' theoretical claims and aims. As Adams puts it: "Habermas is interested in a generalized account of rationalization. The speculative narrative about religion, which is barely defended, is a wholly secondary matter." (152). Indeed, if the leading question for Heidegger was Being, for Habermas it has always been rationality and rationalization in tandem and inseparably. There is no rationality without its becoming, and we are able to grasp the content and form of rationality by reconstructing its becoming, i.e. showing how society is rationalized. Inspired by Marx, Habermas sought the reconstruction of historical materialism in order to give an account of the rationality that would provide the normative foundations for the critique of ideology, which could warrant philosophical critique with a practical intent. Unless historical materialism qua ideology critique normatively justifies its own standpoint of critique, it is reduced to being just another false ideology. How such a normatively justified or secured standpoint or ground could be attained, has been Habermas' relentless pursuit. For this reason, there is no better introduction to Habermas' overall project than the last chapter of volume two of his monumental The Theory of Communicative Action, "The Tasks of a Critical Theory of Society." There Habermas claims that his theory of communicative action is able to deal with three main tasks, which all social theories must face squarely for both empirical and methodological reasons: to provide a theory of rationality as a theory of social rationalization that therefore dispenses with either philosophies of origins or metaphysical theories of history; to provide a theory of society that can differentiate between pathological and non-pathological processes of socialization and individuation; and, third, to provide a theory of modernity, i.e. of our contemporary societal condition. This is an unsatisfactory thumb sketch of the theoretical desideratum that has guided Habermas, but one that at least gives us the sense that for Habermas rationality is never one and it is never static. Rationality is the unity of its instances, i.e. rationalities. Rationality is unified in its diversity, a plurality that is historical and manifested in social institutions and processes. For Habermas, unlike for Hegel and Marx, processes of rationalization are neither ineluctable nor irreversible. Rationality is an achievement, one that is gained and that therefore must be sustained. It is fragile and thus vulnerable and easily reversible -- witness the catastrophes of the twentieth century. Habermas used to talk about rationality as species learning, an achievement of humanity as a species, a Gattung. But already in the work from the seventies, under the influence of Parsons and Luhmann, he started talking about societal learning processes, not species achievements. There was a shift from hermeneutics to philosophical anthropology, and later to systems theory, but amid the heteroglossia of different theoretical approaches, the philosophical intuition about the contingent universality of rationality continued to warm and glow in the cold and crystalline edifice of a communicative theory of rationality, society, and (Western) modernity.

That was a prolegomena to the claim that religion, for Habermas, is both an uncircumventable and indispensable point of reference. For Habermas, religion, as well as theology, is not only a precursor or prior stage of rationality, it is the very catalyst of rationalization. In that famous Habermasian phrase 'the linguistification of religion,' is also the religious rationalization of the sacred into the profane. And this is something that Adams misses in his otherwise competent reading of this famous chapter in TCA. As is noted in the very title of the chapter, "The Rational Structure of the Linguistification of the Sacred," (emphasis added) the very syntax of sacred speech and ritual anticipates and instigates a process of rationalization that comes to create distance between the believer and his/her ritual and sacred text. Ritualized and semanticized, or linguistified, religious experiences catalyze the very rationality that will convert the mystical and sacred into the secular and profane. Marchel Gauchet concludes something similar in his The Disenchantment of the World: A Political History of Religion[7], when he claims that Christian monotheism is already a form of secularization that works against it. John Dominic Crossan, in his works In Parables[8] and Raid on the Articulate[9] claimed something very similar, but with the positive conclusion that Christianity is a religion that instigates perpetual vigilance against its own ossification. Ernst Bloch, anticipating all of the above, claimed that the best Christian was an atheist, and only an atheist would make a good Christian. Adams is not deaf to Habermas' preoccupation with the religious in other parts of his book. In fact, in the chapter where he canvasses very synoptically Habermas' dialogue with the theologians, he notes that Habermas has admonished theologians who have engaged him for not being properly attentive to the religious substance to which they are beholden and for which they are responsible before their respective communities of belief. In any event, almost half a century of sustained engagement with religious questions should not and cannot be met with this claim: "religion is just a casualty of his systematic intentions, and a relatively strong claim is in order: it is a mistake to take Habermas' remarks on religion here [in TCA] too seriously" (152. Emphasis in original).

What, then, remains of this book worth preserving? Chapter six, on "Theology and political theory" was and remains an outstanding engagement because Adams manages to remind us that Habermas had this deep engagement with political theory that included a substantive engagement with Medieval and Early Modern political theories, which per definition had to deal with questions of sovereignty, dominium, authority, the limits and reaches of the power of the church. Adams manages to find serious problems with Habermas' reading of Aquinas and Hobbes. This chapter is a nice introduction to Habermas' thinking on political theology, and can facilitate an engagement with similar debates today: Agamben, Žižek, Milbank, Gauchet, Derrida, and Schmitt resurrected.

The second chapter on "The ideal speech situation" is also an important contribution to a deeper understanding of Habermas' philosophical development, as well as what endures and gives coherence to his work. Adams adroitly discerns in Habermas' coining of the phrase 'ideal speech situation' an attempt to bring together the centripetal forces of Kant and Hegel, the synchronic and the diachronic, the prophetic and the messianic. Adams focuses perspicaciously on a text from 1973, on the "Theories of Truth" in which Habermas talks about the ideal speech situation as being both an "anticipation" (Vorgriff) and a foreshadowing (Vorschein) of a "form of life." (30-1). It would be intellectually gratifying to go over these early attempts by Habermas to make sense of what is both presupposed and anticipated in every speech-act, in every utterance that we make, in every sentence that we enunciate. The ideal speech situation has not lost any of its power, as a philosophically germinal and utopian ideal, even if Habermas has ceased to speak of it. In the end, it was a Gedanken, a thought experiment, no less fraught and contested than Rawls' 'veil of ignorance,' Rousseau's 'General Will,' and Augustine's civitas dei. It would be useful to link Adams' insightful analysis of the 'ideal speech situation' with what Karl-Otto Apel had to say about the 'ideal community of communication' in the introduction to his pivotal and monumental Transformation der Philosophie.[10] There, Apel makes the fascinating claim that Peirce's and Royce's notion of the unlimited community of interpretation has its roots in two ancient themes that have remained in a tense dialectical relation with the Platonic-Aristotelian idea of the agreement or understanding. First, there is the Socratic ideal of dialogue, which always transcends the polis, even as this enables it. Second, there is Christian projection of the community of believers that, as an association that is both real and ideal, is nonetheless called to be actualized in history. This was best articulated in Augustine's juxtaposition between the human city and the divine city.[11] Habermas' ideal speech situation, like Apel's ideal community of communication, is caught in this dialectical tension and asymptotic projection: every argument is squarely poised at the intersection of two linguistic vectors, a diachronic and a synchronic one. Every argument, or speech act, is an argument to a particular community of communication, but it is one that must be defensible before an ideal community of communication. This is true of all philosophical argumentation, argues Apel in his Transformation der Philosophie. That is to say, while philosophy aims at a meta-language, in as much as language is the meta-institution that mediates and holds together all societal institutions, it nonetheless can never do so in any other language than a natural language. The meta-language of philosophy is a natural language. Philosophy, and one should say theology and religion as well, are caught in this dialectical force field. It would like to claim that it accesses something universal, but it can only do so in terms of a natural or historical language, a particular sacred event, and a particular scriptural tradition. The meta-language of religion is always a particular faith. And just as the unity of reason is expressed in the plurality of its philosophical explications and approximations, the unity of the religious phenomenon is expressed in the plurality of its ritualistic and sacred expressions.

Finally, in chapter eight, "Modernity's triumph over theology" Adams raises some very important questions about Habermas' reading of Hegel's philosophy of religion. Adams claims that Habermas misreads Hegel as taking leave of Christianity, whereas in fact it is the former who takes leave of Christianity. Adams supports this claim by trying to show that in fact Hegel sought to

repair the shortcoming of modern philosophical theology, not abandon it. Habermas really does abandon it, while at the same time benefiting from many of its categories, which he takes over in secularized forms. For this reason, Hegel is not suitable for Habermas' purpose. (165)

Whether Hegel in fact is only seeking to repair philosophical theology is as interesting as the question that is here implied: namely whether Hegel is of any use to Habermas. I think there is enough textual evidence sprinkled all over Habermas' massive philosophical corpus to suggest that he holds on to some of Hegel's central insights about the relationship between what we can call the gestalts of 'absolute spirit,' Hegeleanese for societal reflexive self-understandings, and philosophical reflection: philosophy is a particular Zeitgeist crystallized in thought. Hegel's meta-narrative is in fact a theodicy that requires the sacrifice not just of consciousness, but also of all that is its objective representation. The history of reason is the Golgotha of reason's self-immolation on the altar of its own disavowals, appropriation, rejections and preservation. Here one only needs to recall the last lines of the Phenomenology of Spirit,

the two [history and comprehended organization, i.e. philosophical comprehension, phenomenology], comprehended history, form alike the inwardizing and the Calvary of absolute Spirit, the actuality, truth, and certainty of his throne, without which he would be lifeless and alone.[12]

Habermas captures this Hegelian theodicy of reason beautifully when he writes: "Philosophy has no content other than religion, but inasmuch as it transforms this content into conceptual knowledge, 'nothing is [any longer] justified by faith.'" (162) Habermas rightly notes that as with art, so with religion. That is to say, just as art is superseded by and sublated in religion, religion is superseded by and sublated in philosophy. Evidence for the correctness of Habermas' reading of Hegel's views on religion can be found in the latter's Philosophical Encyclopedia. Take for instance paragraph 471:

Philosophy thus understands religion as one of its own presuppositions and as a particular articulation of the absolute totality. It sees through the form of mythical representations by virtue of which the life of the Absolute is pictured in seemingly discrete stories, quasi-temporal myths, and cultic symbols. Philosophy uses such language without being taken captive by it.[13]

For this reason, as with art, so with religion. Hegel announces the death of religion. Habermas, on the other hand, and Adams illustrates this eloquently throughout his otherwise useful book, believes that religion is neither dead, nor completely taken over, or supplanted, by philosophy. In fact, Habermas calls for their co-existence and fruitful dialogue. This is surely not a Hegelian story. In his recent writings on religion, Habermas goes a long way to show how religion continues to be generative for social solidarity (and unrest and enmity) and philosophical creativity.[14]

[1] Jürgen Habermas, Religion and Rationality: Essays on Reason, God, and Modernity (Cambridge: Polity: 2002).

[2] See Jürgen Habermas and Joseph Ratzinger, Dialektik der Säkularisierung. Über Vernunft und Religion (Freiburg: Herder, 2005). A translation of this debate is in Hent de Vries and Lawrence E. Sullivan, eds., Political Theologies: Public Religions in a Post-Secular World (New York: Fordham University Press, 2006).

[3] Jürgen Habermas, Zwischen Naturalismus und Religion: philosophischen Aufsätze (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 2005).

[4] Jürgen Habermas, "Replik auf Einwände, Reaktion auf Anregungen" in Rudolf Langthaler and Herta Nagl-Docekal, eds, Glauben und Wissen. Ein Symposion mit Jürgen Habermas (Wien: Oldenbourg, 2007), 366-414.

[5] George Lichtheim, From Marx to Hegel (New York: Herder and Herder, 1971), 175. The sentence is from an essay originally published in The Times Literary Supplement in 1969.

[6] See Jürgen Habermas, Philosophical-Political Profiles (Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 1983).

[7] Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1997.

[8] San Francisco: Harpercollins, 1973.

[9] New York: Harper & Row, 1976.

[10] Karl-Otto Apel, Transformation der Philosophie, 2 volumes (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp, 1973).

[11] Apel, Transformation der Philosophie, Vol. 1, p. 58-9.

[12] G.W. F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), 493.

[13] Hegel, Encyclopedia of Philosophy, translated and annotated by Gustav Emil Mueller (New York: Philosophical Library, 1959), 283.

[14] See for instance, Jürgen Habermas, "Religion in the Public Sphere" European Journal of Philosophy Vol. 14, No. 1 (2006): 1-25