Habermas: Introduction and Analysis

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David Ingram, Habermas: Introduction and Analysis, Cornell University Press, 2010, 360pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780801476013.

Reviewed by Eduardo Mendieta, Stony Brook University


David Ingram is no neophyte to either Habermas or Frankfurt School Critical Theory. A very good argument can be made, in fact, that Ingram belongs to what has been called 'Third Generation Critical Theory.'[1] His 1987 book, Habermas and the Dialectic of Reason,[2] was indispensable for a new generation of scholars trying to make sense of Habermas' two-volume Theory of Communicative Action (1981) and his Philosophical Discourse of Modernity (1984). Over the last two decades, in addition to editing volumes of the key writings by Frankfurt School critical theorists, he has written a series of books on democracy, rights, globalization, and cosmopolitanism that have traced a distinctive contribution to a more radical understanding of deliberative democracy. Such a sustained engagement with Habermas' work, in particular, and Critical Theory, in general, explains why this book is not simply an introduction.

In fact, more than an "introduction and analysis," it can be said that it is also an immanently critical assessment of Habermas' transformation of Critical Theory. In this sense, in as much as Critical Theory is a tradition whose major task is the immanent critique of reason, Ingram's book is also a contribution to the Critical Theory tradition. Ingram's book is without question the most comprehensive presentation of Habermas' corpus to date. The book is made up of eleven dense yet also clear chapters on different aspects of Habermas' thinking. Ingram is right to claim that at the heart of Habermas' system is his conception of universal pragmatics (p. 72). Universal pragmatics is the caldron in which the linguist turn of early twentieth-century philosophy was melted with action theory and functional systems analysis to provide us with a thoroughly linguistic understanding of reason. At the heart of universal pragmatics is Habermas' analysis of speech acts and the different validity claims that are raised in their performance. The chapters in which Ingram explains and reconstructs Habermas' analysis of the linguistic character of human rationality are surely some of the best I have read, not simply for how comprehensive they are but also because they do not shy away from explicit discussion of objections and problems that Habermas has either failed to address or has subsequently addressed.

Ingram, additionally, has made the right decision to devote four long chapters on what he calls the problem of "Law and Democracy," in which he covers Habermas' derivation of fundamental rights from a proceduralist understanding of law and popular sovereignty, the development of the deliberative model of democracy, a discussion of how this paradigm circumvents or dissolves dilemmas that plagued other models of democracy, and how the discursive theoretical model of law can serve as the foundation for a cosmopolitan order of law that can help us address the global challenges that nation states are no longer able to address. Again, more than simply reconstruction and exposing, Ingram show how Habermas has developed and modified his proceduralist/discursive theory of democracy in a sequence of debates and dialogue with different scholars of law and democracy: most notably Rawls, Dworkin, and Luhmann. In the tenth chapter, "Crisis and Pathology: The Future of Democracy in a Global Age," Ingram focuses on Habermas' contribution to what can be called the project of a "cosmopolitan global constitution" that aims to juridify international relations, while at the same time protecting and advocating respect for local cultural traditions.

The book ends with a "Postsecular Postscript: Modernity and its Discontents" that offers an unsuspecting analysis of Habermas' most recent work in terms of a key preoccupation within the Critical Theory tradition, namely the realization that the progressive rationalization of the world brings with it the evisceration of substantive meanings. Seen through the bars of the iron cage of modernity, the world looks like a frozen landscape in which we stumble in pursuit of our narrow instrumental interests without a sense of whether these ends embody moral goods. Reason, by means of which we survive, has transformed us into soulless technocratic zombies. Against a thoroughly disenchanted world, Habermas raises the possibility of finding aesthetic and ethical inspirations in the semantic meanings preserved in religious traditions. Ingram shows that, notwithstanding Habermas' critique of the totalizing critique of reason that led first generation Frankfurt School theorists into the cul-de-sac of a defeatist dialectic of reason, Habermas has remained attentive to those reservoirs of non-formal meaning that can serve as a north star in the icy waters of a rationalized life-world. By linking Habermas' recent work on what he has called "postsecular consciousness"[3] to the first generation's concern with aesthetics, mimesis, redemption and utopia, Ingram defuses the accusation that Habermas' turn towards pragmatics, a proceduralist understanding of law, and a deliberative theory of democracy meant that he was no longer a Critical Theorist.

To appreciate better what David Ingram has accomplished in this 360 page book, it is necessary to get a sense of the challenges he faced. First, Habermas is still alive, very much alive, and his intellectual vitality has not diminished an iota. In 2009, to celebrate his 80th birthday Suhrkamp Verlag published a five-volume collection of his 'hits,' so to say. The five volumes take up distinct areas to which Habermas has made pioneering contributions: volume one deals with 'the linguistic foundations of sociology,' two with the 'theory of language and rationality', three with 'discourse ethics', four with 'political theory', and the fifth with 'the critique of reason.' Volumes four and five contain long essays written in the last five years, some of which were published for the first time here, when Ingram was composing the first draft of his book. Additionally, each volume opens with an introduction, of lengths varying from 20 to 25 pages -- in the typical Suhrkamp font that forced many a scholar to get new eye glasses on a yearly basis. Added all together, these five separate introductions amount to a medium size book that could be titled "Habermas on Habermas."

In the general preface Habermas notes that he offers a thematically organized selection of the essays that he did not, and could not, put together into a systematic treatise. The edited "student edition" should stand in for his "unwritten monographs." The indirect reference is to his systematic works: Knowledge and Human Interest, Theory of Communicative Action, Between Facts and Norms, and I would add Toward a Reconstruction of Historical Materialism (a book that was partly translated by Tom McCarthy as Communication and the Evolution of Society), a book that anticipates Habermas' systematic intentions. And of course, since these essays are gathered under the general title of "philosophical texts," it is implied that they don't include his "small political texts" (which, depending on how you count them, are at the very least a dozen books containing his polemical interventions in the German, European, and global public spheres). Since 2008, Habermas has been working on a large manuscript on "Faith and Reason" in which he is rethinking Western sociological theory in light of the failure of religion to wither away like a flower in the desert of rationalized world-views. In this manuscript Habermas is also revising his theory of the origins of language, taking up the work of paleontologists, anthropologists, and cognitive and brain development theorists. In addition, he is revisiting his phenomenological theory of the life-world and the emergence of world-views from the secularization of religious doctrines. Some of the themes, issues, and theories he has been busy with in the last five years are anticipated in some of the essays included in volumes four and five of the 2009 Suhrkamp edition of his philosophical texts.[4]

Habermas stepped into public life in 1953 when he published, as a graduate student, his polemical review essay censuring the moral callousness and political incompetence exhibited by Martin Heidegger when he republished his 1935 course Introduction to Metaphysics. Ever since then he has been at the center of public debates, as he has sustained an astonishing generative output, marked by the publication of several volumes that are already classics of contemporary philosophy. Ingram has not cut corners or simplified. He has given us a comprehensive analysis of this incredibly sophisticated theoretical system that has made contributions to every imaginable region of human thinking. There is one issue, however, where David Ingram and other Critical Theorists attempting to do the same task may differ. This difference, though, is not about having gotten something wrong. The issue concerns how to present a system of thought that spans half a century, which has developed along a path that has meant the climbing of tall conceptual edifices (Habermas' 'systematic monographs') followed by meandering through the forests of precise essays in which Habermas has responded to distinct critiques, objections, rebuttals, and replies. Indeed, Habermas is unique among philosophers in that his work has developed in continuous dialogue with other philosophers. If at the heart of Habermas' system is communicative rationality, linguistified reason, his philosophizing has consistently embodied the Socratic virtue of dialogue. For Habermas philosophy is not a holy way, but a dialogic encounter. Ingram has chosen to emphasize systematic coherence and thematic continuity over against brakes, ruptures and shifts. This is partly understandable given that Ingram focuses heavily on the last two decades of Habermas' work, in which there is a substantive unity. Yet, this choice threatens to iron out or pave over the shifts that Habermas' thinking has undergone over the last half a century.

For instance, it can be argued that we can divide Habermas' intellectual itinerary into four major periods, each being marked by what I called a 'tall conceptual' edifice: a first period, which I would call the philosophical anthropological, spanning 1950 to 1968, which closes with the publication of Knowledge and Human Interest. There is a second period, which I would call towards a reconstruction of historical materialism, which culminated in the 1976 publication of the eponymous book. I think 1976 and 1977 marked a major shift when Habermas begins to develop his "universal pragmatics" that culminates with the 1981 publication of his Theory of Communicative Action. A third period, which I would call post-Theory of Communicative Action, spanning 1981 to 2001, during which Habermas develops his own version of discourse ethics, a procedural theory of law, and deliberative democracy. It can be shown that a fourth period begins in 2001, when Habermas published The Future of Human Nature and delivered his "Faith and Knowledge" speech upon receiving the peace prize granted by the German Association of Book Sellers, in which Habermas reverses the priority of justice to ethics as he develops what he calls an "ethics of the species." This is a very rough periodization, some dates may be pushed back or forward. The general idea, however, is to illustrate that there have been some major paradigm shifts in Habermas' thinking, notwithstanding his continuing preoccupation with the 'publicness of reason and the rationality of the public,' to paraphrase the title of a book his students published for his seventieth birthday.

Be that as it may, David Ingram has provided us with what is unquestionably the most comprehensive introduction to one of the most demanding systems of thought, without sacrificing critical distance. The volume, it should not go unnoted, closes with six appendices that survey six areas of philosophical problems that reveal how Habermas is relevant to every major area of philosophical investigation: explaining action, understanding action, Habermas and Brandom, developmental psychology, rational choice theory, systems theory. Each one of these chapters contains annotated bibliographies. In this way the book not only explains Habermas but places him on the map of modern philosophy. The book is a versatile toolbox, which will make it a must for anyone aiming to teach Habermas or the transformations of Critical Theory in the last decades. Above all, however, it is also a substantive contribution to the tradition to which Habermas belongs, for it is a critique of reason by way of an immanent critique of communicative rationality itself. Seasoned Habermasians will have to read it as well.

[1] See Joel Anderson, "The 'Third Generation' of the Frankfurt School" (accessed February 6, 2011).

[2] David Ingram, Habermas and the Dialectic of Reason (New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1987).

[3] See Mendieta, Eduardo, "A postsecular world society?: an interview with J├╝rgen Habermas." The Immanent Frame, 2010 (accessed February 6, 2011).

[4] I have discussed this recent work in my essays: "Rationalization, Modernity, and Secularization" in Barbara Fultner, eds. Habermas: Key Concepts (Durham, UK: Acumen, 2011), 222-238, and "Spiritual Politics and Post-secular Authenticity: Foucault and Habermas on post-metaphysical religion" in Phil Gorski, David Kim, John Torpey, Jonathan VanAntwerpen, eds. The Post-Secular In Question (New York: NYU Press, forthcoming).