Habilitation, Health, and Agency: A Framework for Basic Justice

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Lawrence C. Becker, Habilitation, Health, and Agency: A Framework for Basic Justice, Oxford University Press, 2012, 208pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199917549.

Reviewed by David A. Crocker, University of Maryland


In this innovative and challenging volume, Becker offers a meta-theoretical framework to reorient all "plausible, full scale philosophical, normative theories of justice" (159). He repeatedly reminds the reader that he is not offering a rival theory of justice, one with either distributive principles -- who should get what benefits and burdens -- or ideal institutional arrangements. Rather Becker aims to provide "materials from which distributive principles can be developed, criticized, adopted, applied, revised, refined or rejected" (4, see also 159).

Although Becker intends his account to be non-prejudicial with respect to any -- at least, "plausible" -- normative theory of justice, his framework does have some general normative priorities, namely, a guiding intuition, a background concept of "basic justice," and three general concepts that, he contends, should inform and constrain -- or, at least, be addressed by -- any normative theory of distributive justice. Becker's guiding intuition is captured by what many hold to be common sense:

It is common to think that good health is the most basic thing of all. If we lack it, and cannot get it back, nothing else much matters. When we have it, we have the basis for achieving, enjoying and making the most of every other basic good. And staying healthy is linked to many of those other basic goods; many of them are necessary for sustaining health. So it is natural to think -- almost proverbial to think -- that health is at the very center of what matters most to us. (20)

Informed by this intuition about the primacy of good health, Becker offers a meta-theoretical framework in which "basic justice" is a background concept. In a world marked by war within and among individuals as well as within and among groups, justice concerns what we "require" of ourselves and others in relation to matters over which we have direct (personal) or indirect (institutional) control. Basic justice, in contrast to ideal justice, identifies (i) the most fundamental part of justice and (ii) where plausible normative theories converge. Moreover, basic justice should be formulated in norms (iii) acceptable to all moral agents, regardless of their religious or other ultimate commitments and (iv) that "have to do with enforceable, practicable, social, or political goals for human conduct" (159). With this concept of basic justice, which he works out in relation to the three concepts summarized below, Becker believes that his framework provides theory-independent criteria for evaluating -- and settling disputes among -- particular normative theories with respect to "relevance, completeness, accuracy, and effectiveness" (18). What is unclear is how Becker's theory can be neutral with respect to various theories of justice and still be a basis for assessing and improving them. Would it not be better to call his framework a partial normative theory of justice or a theory (with normative components) about normative theories of justice? Such a designation would fit Becker's own view that there is a spectrum that ranges from full normative theories, which offer distributive principles as well as "metrics," to meta-theories that only offer metrics that answer the questions such as "equality of (or justice with respect to) what?"

The three concepts that make up Becker's framework for basic justice are habilitation, health, and agency. In this and the next paragraph I give a brief introduction to the three concepts, then do additional analysis, some assessment, and present an alternative view. Becker takes the archaic word "habilitation," and elevates it to a commanding position in his framework's architecture. Becker employs "habilitation" to mean "equipping someone or something with capacities or functional abilities" (3). In English, the verb "habilitate" is now archaic, and the similar verb "capacitate" is seldom heard in English. (However, in Spanish "capacitar" (and "capacitación") is commonly used and means "to qualify" or "to train" somebody in something.) Echoes of "habilitation," remain, however, in our frequent use of "rehabilitation" in which damaged abilities are restored. Human beings, never completely self-sufficient, are more or less needy. In order to survive, let alone thrive, human individuals and groups must act. In habilitation, humans act to change themselves, others, or the natural and social environment. The result is a more or less "hospitable" social environment. The problem of basic justice is not to resolve the conflict between the individual and the group but rather to answer the question "how much habilitation should be available to whom, and provided by whom, and for how long?" (18)

The "centerpiece" of habilitation, the result of habilitative success, is a hospitable environment. The salutary result for humans is basic good health, which Becker defines as "reliably competent physical and psychological functioning in a given environment" (45). Habilitation is for basic good health rather than ideal good health or, such things as income, wealth, happiness, or freedom. Basic good health, the metric or currency of basic justice, has both negative and positive aspects. The negative dimension includes absence of disease, illness, disability, and other impairments. The positive aspect is the third concept in Becker's triumvirate, namely, "robustly active agency." To be healthy is to have a kind of agency appropriate to the stages on life's way -- from infancy to mature adulthood to old age.

Let us turn now to a more detailed analysis and assessment of Becker's tripartite framework. Becker's concept of habilitation prepares the way for his proposed metric of health and practical target of healthy agency. If humans were perfectly healthy, self-sufficient, and invulnerable to threats, there would be no reason to act upon the natural and social environment. If we were powerless effects of external and internal causes, actions would be futile. Becker assumes, however, that humans, are able to shape -- in different ways and degrees -- themselves, other people, and the environment. One way to do this shaping is to equip or "habilitate" ourselves, others, or (by metaphorical extension) things with abilities to function in certain predictable and desirable ways. Our parents teach us how to grow corn and we, in turn, "equip" the earth -- by plowing, planting, fertilizing, and watering -- to bring forth life-sustaining food. Although the soil does not have "abilities" or capacities in the same way people do, both have different potentialities or dispositions to "behave" in predictable ways.

Becker gives us an attractive picture of habilitation. Neither completely self-sufficient nor utterly powerless, we humans can act not just to survive, but also to pursue our own sense of a good or better life. We do so by self-help (self-habilitation), acquiring new skills and capabilities. As parents and teachers, we habilitate others to "capacitate" themselves and others (including us, for example, in our old age). We habilitate our natural environment with agriculture, roads, and buildings and our social environment with institutions and policies, which in turn sometimes habilitate us in additional ways. As agents, capable of habilitating action, we know that human agency and structures are not always at odds and that the latter can manifest as well as "habilitate" the former.

Habilitative efforts, for Becker, are more or less successful and have better or worse results. Some people are habilitated in extremely negative ways. Some habilitated natural and social environments (for example, a drought-stricken desert or Syria in 2012) are inhospitable -- if not disastrous -- for human life and well-being. It is with the concept of basic good health that Becker proposes a criterion for success or a metric for identifying just habilitative conduct. Among the many possibilities for habilitation, he proposes that success with respect to basic justice occurs when (and only when) people exhibit "reliably competent physical and psychological functioning in a given environment" (43).

What, more specifically, does Becker mean by "basic good health"? First, he conceives both good and ill health as types of physical and psychological functioning with causation running in both directions. There can be either virtuous or vicious circles in which physical and psychological dimensions affect each other for good or ill, respectively. Second, he presents good health as both the absence of negative aspects, e.g., infections and impairments, and the presence of positive factors, e.g., resistance to ill health, resilience in avoiding relapse, restorative resources, and "agentic-energy" (84). Third, Becker calls his concept of health "necessity-based" rather than "freedom-based" because he emphasizes those capacities that are necessary for an individual's health in particular environments. Fourth, he proposes a (complex) unitary conception of health rather than a pluralistic one. Although unitary, his conception is capacious because it contains many capacities, such as resistance, resilience, restorative abilities, and agent-energy. Moreover, Becker offers good health as a good that represents all the other goods about which we are concerned. These other goods, Becker claims, are either causes or effects of good health. (Why should the causes and effects of good health be counted as components of good health?)

Good health, then, allegedly gives us a unitary (if complex) metric to assess habilitative success and failure: it is Becker's candidate for a, or, better, the representative good, which Becker defines as "a single, observable, and scalable item from which it is possible to infer the presence, absence, quantity, or quality of all the items with which we are concerned" (9). The one item, health, functions as an "index" for a whole bundle of goods. Becker contends that any theory of distributive justice benefits from -- if it does not require -- a representative good in terms of which it can quantify and assess actual and proposed distributions.

While Martha Nussbaum proposes "bodily health" as one item on her list of 10 incommensurable valuable capabilities, Becker uses basic good health to include or represent all other goods.[1] Like Nussbaum, however, Becker wants to block any account that subordinates health to -- or trades it off for -- other goods. It is precisely at this point that Amartya Sen's freedom-oriented,agency-focused, and explicitly democratic alternative becomes attractive. By "capacity" Becker means skill or ability. This is in contrast to Sen's or Nussbaum's capability approaches in which capability is an effective and substantive freedom, one made practically possible by both a person's abilities and a favorable environment. According to Sen, we as agents have the substantive freedom or meta-capability to choose from among various freedoms, including the freedom to be healthy or the freedom to starve ourselves in a hunger strike against political repression. ForSen health is one among many goods and we exercise our agency by choosing for or against health.

Often the many good things, even within the complex good of health, cannot coexist together, and we individually or collectively must decide which is most important at a particular time and place. It is not an oversight that the words "participation," "public discussion," and "democracy" do not appear in Becker's index. Becker does (correctly) insist that what is necessary for habilitation and health varies from environment to environment. What he fails to recognize is that sometimes a hard choice must be made among separable and competing goods and that the most normatively and practical defensible way to make that choice is through some form of inclusive and democratic decision making. Pace Nussbaum but similar to Becker, Sen in his meta-theory of -- or, "idea" of -- justice eschews proposing a distributive principle or blueprints. Yet, unlike Becker, Sen recognizes that individual or collective trade-offs often must be made (because goods sometimes do not go together), and he defends a pubic discussion and other democratic procedures to make that choice. Becker does see that Sen's approach to social choice lacks the structure of either Nussbaum's version of the capability approach or Becker's own theory (21). But Becker fails to see that Sen has made a democratic turn beyond general social choice and now embraces the role of public discussion and democratic bodies in combating injustice and prioritizing, selecting, and protecting valuable freedoms.[2]

The role that Sen gives to democratic decision making in fashioning, weighing, and selecting norms, Becker gives to an optimistic and evolutionary theory of healthy human development. In this theory, explained in the most difficult section of the book, what proves necessary for healthy individual and societal development more or less "matches" or "maps on to" some widely accepted norms of basic justice and personal obligation, such as mutual restraint and mutual aid. It is not inconsistent with other such norms: "Basically healthy people, in genuinely hospitable environments, will be strongly motivated . . . away from self-destructive or self-defeating behavior and toward accomplishing the habilitative tasks necessary for sustained good health" (139-40). One wonders, however, whether healthy Bedouins do not survive and even thrive in inhospitable environments precisely because of mutual aid. And might not there be, as Becker seems to recognize in some Hobbesian passages (see 177), some real life Gordon Gecko ("Greed is good") who is all too fit?

We come, finally, to Becker's concept of "robustly healthy agency." I applaud Becker for recognizing the empirical and moral importance of individual and collective agency and the role they might play in a meta-theory of justice. What does Becker mean by agency and by robustly healthy agency, in particular? Why does he assign so much importance to these concepts? Becker conceives of agency "simply as purposive behavior, with the practical abilities necessary for at least occasional success in achieving important goals, and with the specific form of energy needed for initiating and sustaining effective purposive activity (call it agentic-energy)" (50). In agency, a human being acts on purpose (not accidentally) and for a purpose (not aimlessly). At least sometimes, agents achieve their goals. I would go a step further and add that the result of complete agentic action makes some difference in the world. Finally, to my mind, Becker unnecessarily adds that an agent's goals are "important." Just as agency need not be moral agency, a view that he accepts, an agent can pursue trivial goals, and moral agents can have immoral goals.

Becker helpfully identifies types of agency on the basis of degrees of language use, self-awareness, memory, imagination, reflection, deliberation, planning, choice, and "self-habilitation" in the sense of "the ability to be the author of one's own life". These types range from "impersonal animal agency, in which there is no self-awareness, to complex rational and moral agency"(90). A hospitable environment and habilitation by others promote and sustain the development of an individual's agency. Becker, however, rightly stresses that moral agency, choices that consider non-self-regarding acts, must be largely "self-supplied." Humans become more robust agents by exercising their own agency. In robust agency, people run their own lives rather than being either the passive recipients of others' help (or hindrance) or the helpless victims of the impersonal forces of circumstance. Although he does not appreciate the crucial role the ideal of agency plays in Sen's work, Becker would agree with Sen's "agent-oriented view" expressed in the following passage:

With adequate social opportunities, individuals can effectively shape their own destiny and help each other. They need not be seen primarily as passive recipients of the benefits of cunning development programs. There is indeed a strong rationale for recognizing the positive role of free and sustainable agency -- and even of constructive impatience.[3]

Given this interesting similarity between Becker and Sen, it is striking how differently they employ their concepts of agency. For Becker, agency is necessary (and sufficient) for health, and as we saw, health is the good that represents all other good things. So agency is a necessary aspect of human well-being. Well-being requires at least rudimentary agency, and agency is thehabilitative "target" because agency inevitably leads -- by what seems to be a natural teleology -- to health and the other good things that health represents. Except in marginal or extreme situations, which Becker tends to ignore, Becker's healthy agents do not decide between agency and health or between agency and well-being. In contrast, for Sen, agency should be distinguished from instead of fused with health and well-being. It is true that well-being provides a "platform" for a person's exercise of choice. Although Sen concedes that agency and well-being, including health, often go together, they sometimes do not. We often do and sometimes should, at least in the short run, subordinate our health to other aims, for instance, finishing a book, staying up all night with a sick child, putting ourselves in harm's way to defend another human being, or going on a hunger strike to protest unjust practices. Although we have ample reason to value healthy functioning and the freedom to so function, we also value the freedom to decide how important health is to be in our lives in relation to other capabilities and functioning and, at times, to sacrifice our own well-being to other ends. Sen's distinction between agency and well-being also enables him to do justice to another aspect of human conduct that Becker's account does not provide for: there is good reason to value the good health of people who have not yet attained or no longer have (much) agency (e.g., the very young, extremely disabled, enslaved, and very old).[4] Becker's monistic theory of the currency of justice prevents him from doing justice in these cases.

To sum up, Becker proposes his concepts of habilitation, health, and agency as the framework for basic justice, a framework that, he insists should inform or constrain any normative theory of distributive justice. What are the implications of this meta-theory of what Rawls called the "basic structure of society"? Regretfully, although Becker insists that robustly healthy agency "is not an empty target for public policy," his framework offers us little beyond "assum[ing] that making adequate social arrangements for habilitating people into robustly healthy agency is something every normative theory of justice should address -- either by accepting some version of this goal or offering an alternative to it" (93). One reason for this tolerant open-endedness with respect to social arrangements is that Becker emphasizes the radical differences among societies with respect to such variables as resources, population density, proportion of healthy people, technology, cultural norms, and political constitutions.

Another reason for his relative silence on facilitating structures is that Becker stresses the duties of actual rulers rather than the implementation of equal rights of people to well-being and agency, including the right to participate in governing. Such rights, contends Becker, have no rational foundation -- especially when compared with the worldwide affirmation of the importance of healthy agency. In enlightened, if not benevolent, dictatorships, "healthy despots" (176) have no duty to transition to democracy or respect their "subjects'" right to self-government. Rather, for Becker, such despots have the duty only to stay healthy themselves and to do so by extending the circle of health to others. Rather than equal dignity, equal rights, and democratic commitments motivating the struggle for basic justice in every society, Becker sees such norms as a result of basic justice that evolves by the evolutionary extension of health either in complex societies or in those "simpler" societies that interact with complex neighbors.

Aware that his view might leave him open to a charge that his meta-theory of justice provides insufficient protections for some groups and individuals, Becker briefly considers whether a human rights approach would be more normatively compelling. For Becker, however, a human rights approach is objectionable. It would be "pulled out of thin air," deduced from "a contestable normative theory" (178) or derived from a (presumably, provincial) "political tradition" (178). Unfortunately, Becker does not consider James W. Nickel's approach to justifying human rights in which he appeals to moral claims that arguably are "reliable in the sense that rational, reflective and morally sensitive people continue over time to find them appealing and do not discover reasons for rejecting them."[5] Nickel offers what he calls four secure moral claims or abstract rights which, if realized, "would make possible for every person living today to have and lead a life that is decent or minimally good."[6] These four include (i) the secure claim to have a life, including satisfying of basic needs; (ii) the secure claim to lead one's life autonomously, including the having of "social conditions in which the capacity for agency can be developed and exercised"; (iii) a secure claim against cruel and degrading punishment; and (iv) a secure claim against severely unfair treatment.

Becker fuses the first two of Nickel's secure claims together and makes no space for Nickel's commitments to an egalitarian floor or to fairness. Arguably an inclusive democracy not only protects and specifies these rights but offers the social conditions and fair political processes in which citizens -- whether healthy or not -- are free to exercise and develop their agency. One way to justify democracy is to view it as an exercise of individual and collective agency in which people together are authors of their own lives and govern themselves. Another way, and this circles back to the importance of prioritizing freedoms, is that in and through democratic bodies group members may weigh, prioritize, and choose which freedoms they judge as most urgent in their particular circumstances. The rights to health, agency, and fairness give all humans a basis for dignity and just treatment. Democracy, taking diverse forms in different contexts, both exercises and protects the health and agency that Becker takes to be the core of basic justice.


Thanks to Matthew Regan, Stacy J. Kosko, and David Wasserman for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.

[1] Martha C. Nussbaum, Creating Capabilities: The Human Development Approach (Cambridge, MA and London, England: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2011), ch. 2.

[2] Amartya Sen, The Idea of Justice (Cambridge: Belknap, Harvard University Press, 2009), especially chs. 15-16

[3] Sen, Development as Freedom, 11.

[4] Crocker and Robeyns, "Capability and Agency" in Christopher W. Morris, ed. Amartya Sen (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010), 60-90.

[5] James W. Nickel, Making Sense of Human Rights, 2nd. Ed. (Malden, MA: Blackwell, 2007): 61. Nickel refers to the similar justificatory view of James Griffin, Value Judgments: Improving Our Ethical Beliefs (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996).

[6] Nickel, Making Sense of Human Rights, 62.