Hamann and the Tradition

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Lisa Marie Anderson (ed.), Hamann and the Tradition, Northwestern University Press, 2012, 226pp., $79.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810127982.

Reviewed by Ted Kinnaman, George Mason University


The essays in this volume are based on work presented at a conference at Hunter College in 2009. The conference and book include some of the most prominent Hamann scholars in the world. This volume thus offers a good picture of the current state of the scholarship on this fascinating but still little-appreciated figure of the German 18th century.

Most of the essays seem to be written with two purposes in mind. The first, of course, is to explicate the writings of Hamann, particularly their reception in and effects on later philosophers, especially those in the German idealist tradition. At the same time, most of the essays are also concerned to argue that their subject deserves much greater attention than he has hitherto received, particularly in the English-speaking world. The lightning rod for these arguments is Isaiah Berlin's 1994 The Magus of the North: J.G. Hamann and the Origins of Modern Irrationalism. Berlin drew unprecedented interest to Hamann among English-speaking readers. And, as the book's title indicates, Berlin understood Hamann to be not only a critic of certain strands of the Enlightenment, but also an irrationalist -- an interpretation that most of the authors are at pains to refute.

This is clearest in the first two essays, by John R. Betz and Kenneth Haynes, respectively. Betz takes up this task most directly. His chapter charts Hamann's reception in German discourse from the late 18th century to Kierkegaard. His piece is well-suited to leading off a volume on Hamann's place in the Western tradition, because it traces the "subterranean" path whereby Hamann's writing exerted influence without, however, bringing him fame, or even familiarity. Betz attributes this at least in part to Hamann's famously difficult, even opaque style, which is laden with allusions to literature in a half dozen languages. As Betz explains, Hamann drew interest from most of the important post-Kantian German thinkers, such as Schelling and Goethe, among others, most of whom cannot be labeled "irrationalist." Chief among these was Hegel, who in 1828 published a long review of the first edition of Hamann's works. Although Hegel faulted Hamann for his lack of a system, he approved of precisely the aspect of Hamann's thought that militates against subjectivism, namely his emphasis on revelation as a basis for objectivity.

Nevertheless, whatever the shortcomings of Berlin's reading of Hamann, Betz's argument is hardly sufficient to discredit it. That Hamann drew the interest of thinkers who were not irrationalist in no way implies, of course, that he was not. Haynes takes a different approach to explaining Hamann's absence from the "canon" of modern Western philosophy. He traces the relatively infrequent references to Hamann in histories of philosophy, rather than in the works of the philosophers themselves, written in German in the first part of the 19th century. His examination sheds light not only on Hamann's relative marginalization but also on the tendency, not new with Isaiah Berlin, to characterize Hamann as an irrationalist or antirationalist, to be filed alongside F. H. Jacobi.

Part 2, "Hamann in Dialogue," contains some of the most interesting essays, particularly the first two. Gwen Griffith-Dickson puts Hamann's work into relation with personalism the view (most prominent in the 20th century), that puts the person, both human and divine, at the center of theological and philosophical thought. Griffith-Dickson's fascinating essay goes over some ground familiar to readers of Hamann, such as his views on knowledge and language. She sheds new light by connecting Hamann's thought on these topics to his conception of the person. That conception is, she argues, fundamentally relational: "Hamann's picture of the human person is of a creature that is fundamentally related to others -- both to other humans and to God -- as part of its own being." (p. 55) Thus Griffith-Dickson notes, in discussing Hamann's views on knowledge, that for him "the question of certainty is connected with the desire to prove and convince another." (p. 58) Similarly, language for Hamann is "a relational entity which mediates between the signified and those who perceive significance." (p. 59). All of this, of course, is instrumental to Hamann's understanding of the dialogical relation of human beings to God. In this Hamann anticipates such later thinkers as Ferdinand Ebner, Franz Rosenzweig, and Martin Buber.

Manfred Kuehn's "Hamann and Kant on the Good Will," is one of the volume's few essays to offer a critical view of Hamann's achievement. Kuehn focuses on Hamann's view of moral, rather than speculative philosophy, in particular on his critique of Kant's notion, central to his moral theory, of a good will. He notes (pp. 67-8) that "there is no extended discussion in Hamann's work that would treat the 'good will' in as thorough a fashion as he had treated 'pure reason,'" and poses the question why this is so. Kuehn proposes that this is no mere historical accident. Rather, he argues, Hamann could offer no metacritique of practical reason because "his [i.e. Hamann's] critique of philosophical ethics just formulates an alternative without really engaging the philosopher." Looking at Hamann's reaction to reading Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Kuehn notes that Hamann assimilates the good will to pure reason, saying that both are mere "chimeras [Hirngespinste]."

Thus the same criticisms Hamann leveled against the first Critique apply to the Kantian moral philosophy as well. Specifically (though Hamann does not make this point explicitly), practical reason is just as dependent on the contingency of language as is speculative reason. Indeed more so. Kuehn quotes Hamann's claim that "morality is nothing but syntax," and concludes that correct language use "is not just important for ethics; it is a fundamental feature of ethics," and "the overriding demand on philosophers, even if they don't understand this." (p. 71) Kuehn also cites with approval Hamann's suggestion that Kant's moral theory does not contain anything really new in relation, say, to Enlightenment thinkers such as Lessing. But in the end Kuehn criticizes Hamann's moral thought, for the simple reason that, in contrast, for example, to his criticisms of Kant's theoretical philosophy, in the moral sphere Hamann does not "refute the Enlightenment on its own terms." (p. 76) Instead, Kuehn argues, Hamann merely, if "brilliantly," presents one Christian alternative to the moral thought of Kant and the Enlightenment more generally, availing himself of ad hominem arguments against the Jewish Aufklärer Moses Mendelssohn along the way.

Any volume on Hamann's place in the philosophical tradition will have to include contributions on his influence on Søren Kierkegaard. Hamann's work had a tremendous and well-known impact on the Danish philosopher. Both were Protestants motivated by their perception of the inadequacy of Enlightenment thought to religious truth, and, not coincidentally, both published their principal works pseudonymously, as an exercise in "indirect communication."

Kelly Dean Jolley and Stephen Cole Leach each offer essays exploring the rich relationship between Hamann and Kierkegaard. Jolley's piece connects them through their shared invocation of Socrates as a foil for the Enlightenment. In what he calls a "metaschematism" he argues that for both authors the meaning of Socrates is that he is primarily a practical rather than a theoretical thinker -- and that this is just what Enlightenment philosophers fail to recognize about him. Thus, for example, the method of elenchus "is more a method of spiritual exercise than it is a method of theoretical investigation," as it aims not at bringing Socrates' interlocutors closer to knowledge, but rather to bring about "repentance." (p. 81) Similarly, Socratic ignorance is "better seen as a spiritual achievement than as an epistemic failure." (p. 87)

In "Skepticism and Faith in Hamann and Kierkegaard," Leach opens with the surprising assertion that "There is little indication on the surface . . . that Hamann had a profound effect on Kierkegaard." (p. 93) Leach finds this effect by turning to Kierkegaard's journals, where we can see, he argues, that the connection between them hinges on their shared interest in philosophical skepticism as a sort of self-refutation of philosophy. For Hamann this self-refutation is executed most clearly by David Hume; Kierkegaard, on the other hand, who knew little of Hume, preferred the ancient Skeptics. Both, as is well-known, used the image of "honest" Socrates as a foil for the spiritually dishonest thought of the Enlightenment. Leach notes, however, that Kierkegaard took issue with Hamann's equation of revelation with experience simpliciter.

The collection concludes with three discussions about theological aspects of Hamann's work. Johannes von Lüpke places Hamann's conception of "metacritique" of reason in the context of Lutheran criticism, which he argues Hamann appropriates in order to formulate "a different concept of God and a different path of theological perception." (p. 176) Von Lüpke sees Hamann's metacritique as an effort to bring together general philosophical reason and "the specific reason of 'receiving' faith," (p. 177) which is a good way of capturing both the negative and the constructive aspects of Hamann's approach. Katie Terezakis examines how Hamann's view of theology holds up against criticism from "radically orthodox" John Milbank. She argues that the heart of Milbank's criticism, and also Hamann's strength, can be traced to his surprisingly favorable use of the Kantian notion of the regulative ideal, which Hamann uses in order to avoid both nihilism and dogmatism.

The third theologian is Oswald Bayer, the preeminent authority on Hamann on either side of the Atlantic, without whom no volume on Hamann would really be complete. In "God as Author: On the Theological Foundations of Hamann's Authorial Poetics", Bayer gives detailed attention to Hamann's very influential concept of genius, which is surprisingly neglected elsewhere in the volume. Bayer emphasizes an often underappreciated fact about Hamann's view, namely that genius consists not in "unbounded subjectivity," but rather in "structured freedom": "For Hamann, the word 'genius' means a responsive creativity; and because of this, the freedom of the genius is not absolute but relative: a response to an antecedent word." (p. 163) Those words include creation itself, of which God is the author. It is thus in the nature of genius to be dependent on the language use of others, an insight rich in consequences for reading Hamann. It entails, for example, a special task for the genius:

the "genius's" freedom from "artistic rules" and "critical laws" consists precisely in engaging the actually existing ways in which language is used: specifically, the ways in which language is employed also to distort truth; the ways in which it is subjected to a dominant, regularized speaking; and the ways in which language can hereby become both a "tyrant" and a "sophist," which can end up misleading more than one's intellect only. (p. 164)

In the remainder of the chapter Bayer puts Hamann's genius in the context of the Trinitarian doctrine of God's condescension to humans, which is connected to the power God gave Adam to name the animals, thus making every human being an author.

Bayer then relates the notion of condescension to Hamann's own authorship, most interestingly in his discussion of Hamann's famously difficult and idiosyncratic style. For Hamann, he argues,

a good style is one that heeds to God's word and expresses a response to God, the primordial author, the Author as such; a bad style, on the other hand, is one where the human author seeks to be the own ground of his ingenuity and individuality and would thereby usurp the place of the divine author and creator. (p. 171)

Of course, one might reasonably ask what this says about Hamann's own ingenious and individualistic style. Bayer explains that for Hamann, authorship grounded in a relationship to God also opens "a wide field of possibilities . . . full of the riches of a qualified, defined, and unmistakable individuality." (pp. 171-2) This offers a context for understanding the distinctive intertextuality of Hamann's style, that is, his reliance in building his argument on frequent references to other texts in a half dozen languages other than German. Bayer characterizes this as "simultaneously individual and indebted to what is already given." (p. 172)