Phantoms of the Other: Four Generations of Derrida's Geschlecht

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David Farrell Krell, Phantoms of the Other: Four Generations of Derrida's Geschlecht, SUNY Press, 2015, 357pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438454504.

Reviewed by N. Gabriel Martin, University of Sussex


More radiantly raising his hands to his star,

The white stranger;
Silently something dead abandons the ruined house.

Oh, the decomposed figure of humankind: joined of cold metals,
Night and terror of sunken forests,
And the singeing savagery of the animal;
Doldrums of the Soul.

-- from Georg Trakl, "Septet of Death", on p. 295

The ghosts that haunt David Farrell Krell's new book are never summoned. What manifests this book is a twin haunting: first, the ghost of a text never written by Derrida, which would have concerned Heidegger's discussions of the poetry of Georg Trakl (especially "Language in the Poem"[1]); second, the phantoms of the other, which haunt Heidegger's philosophy. Krell's spectral inspiration is never allowed to take on corporeal form, in part due to his respect for Derrida's injunction not to circulate or even cite the incomplete typescript Derrida shared with him (see p. 133). The phantom is also glimpsed in Derrida's lecture course, "Nationalité et Nationalisme Philosophiques: le Fantôme de l'Autre", which Krell supposes "was most likely the course that Derrida had been transcribing in the typescript" (p. 171). This unborn text is Derrida's missing "Geschlecht" -- the missing generation (Geschlecht) of Derrida's essays on the differences denied ontological significance by Heidegger -- that haunts the interval between the second ("Heidegger's Hand"[2]), and the "fourth" ("Heidegger's Ear: Philopolemology"[3]). The first is "Geschlecht: Sexual Difference, Ontological Difference".[4] In addition to the chapters devoted to the typescript and the lecture course, the book includes: a chapter on Of Spirit; chapters on each of the three extant "Geschlecht" essays; a more wide-ranging chapter on Trakl's poetry and biography, especially his close relationship with his sister Gretl; and helpful appendices consisting of Krell's own translations of a selection of Trakl's poems. The book's structure is given by the series of texts discussed, all of which concern closely related but distinct themes.

In a note on the title "Geschlecht: Sexual Difference, Ontological Difference", Derrida describes the project launched by it as 'situating' the word Geschlecht, a word without French or English counterparts, in "Heidegger's path of thought"[5]. This word summons a host of ideas: humanity, nations, race, species, genre, family, generations, and sex. By insisting on the word that for us is not a word, Derrida refuses to reduce it to a translation or to an overarching idea -- there is no single thing or category which can exhaust the polysemy of Geschlecht, or the themes of this book. Yet is it too much to say that what is interesting to Derrida and Krell in 'Geschlecht' is differences to which Heidegger refuses to give ontological significance; differences which have nothing to do with our finding ourselves, yet which Krell worries at least play their parts in Dasein's Befindlichkeit, which is to say, in who each of us is (see p. 20)?

Rather than lumping the different differences together, each is considered in its own way, yet without keeping them strictly separate. Sexual difference is the "proper subject" of the missing text, according to Krell. But even this problematic is only an apparition of an apparition -- it only shows itself at the end of the incomplete typescript (see p. 160). In a sentence that seems to capture the motivation of both Derrida's and Krell's engagements with Heidegger, Krell writes: "Heidegger is haunted by certain phantoms, phantoms of the 'other', ghosts that he himself has raised and can no longer lay to rest, but which he seeks to avoid." (p. 174) This Freudian question of avoidance echoes the opening line of "Geschlecht: Sexual Difference, Ontological Difference": "Of sex, one can readily remark, yes, Heidegger speaks as little as possible, perhaps he has never spoken of it."[6] In that text, Krell explains, Derrida takes issue with the sexlessness of Dasein, the refusal to invest ontological meaning in either sexual relation or sexual difference. Dasein is, of course, always either male or female, but this difference is as neutral as Dasein is -- the difficulty is not in the difference, but in the discord contaminating the difference.

With respect to the spectral Geschlecht, Krell is to a large extent concerned with the puzzling theme that occupied his "Schlag der Liebe, Schlag des Todes: On a theme in Heidegger and Trakl"[7], with which Derrida was familiar, citing it at length in his "Heidegger's Hand"[8]: when in "Language in the Poem" Heidegger apparently breaks from his habitual avoidance of sex, he stipulates that the discord among the 'fragmented kind' ('verfallene Geschlecht')[9], being sexes, nations, etc. is according to Trakl the curse of 'decomposition' (see p. 62) that afflicts us. It is not the differences, among which sexual difference has a special place, that is our curse, Heidegger avers, but the discord among them. As such, humanity can find what seems to be a way out of the curse of discord -- not to a primal simplicity but to a 'simple twofoldness' ('einfältigen Zweifalt')[10]. This way, clear of the curse is not something that a 'fragmented Geschlecht' can find on its own. It must follow a stranger.

The paradox of a 'simple twofoldness' and the hope of a way out of decomposition led by the stranger are surely appealing to Derrida and Krell. On the other hand, they share an uneasiness about Heidegger's taming of the strange and of the stranger who is not infinitely remote, but "just ahead of us on 'our' path" (p. 174). His thinking of the strange in terms of the etymology of the German word fremd emphases its sense as being moved toward, taking some of the strangeness out of the strange (see p. 148). Furthermore, that the strange can only be understood in this way means that Heidegger's own language must be employed. Krell writes: "Heidegger plumbs the foreign precisely by never venturing into it; indeed, he insists that everything foreign can be thought only in unserer Sprache [in our language]." (p. 146) Krell makes some effort to defend Heidegger -- mentioning that, in the essay "Words" from On the Way to Language,[11] he is aware of the seriousness of the failure of translation -- though he seems to think little of this defense. And yet, there is a paradoxical sense to Heidegger's domestication of the strange, and to the way he thinks about the experience of the veiled: "As mystery, the word remains remote. As a mystery that is experienced, the remoteness is near."[12]

Krell links this reductive approach to otherness with Heidegger's central concept of 'gathering' (das Versammeln) that describes not only the twofoldness of a single humanity, but the unity of poetic and linguistic polysemy in the single unspoken poem which Heidegger says constitutes Trakl's work. Heidegger aims at commentary and interpretation that can situate a poem (passim, p. 135); and in the finitude of that site negotiate "the tension in Heidegger's proscription of all dissemination of meaning -- while affirming nonetheless the essential polysemy or Mehrdeutigkeit of poetic language" (p. 180). The poem should gather in its site without the reduction of its polysemy and interpretability.

In his "Spirit's Living Hand", William McNeill took issue with this interpretation of gathering, as it is presented in Derrida's "Heidegger's Hand", for ignoring the non-oppositionality of gathering and dispersion.[13] But here Krell reinforces his point, explaining that even the meaning of dissemination would be different for Heidegger:

Whereas for Derrida dissemination leaves only traces of sense, recognizing as it does the archaic non-origin of all meaning, for Heidegger dissemination is that paradox of a mightiness of essence that peters out into a scattering of forces, a kind of ontic-existential entropy. (p. 137)

That is, the kind of dissemination that is not in opposition to gathering is a watered-down dissemination. Or would the right metaphor be 'an overbuilt dissemination'? Though he occasionally echoes objections along the lines of McNeill's, for the most part Krell seems to share Derrida's worries, and he voices them most affectingly in the course of the brief chapter on "Heidegger's Ear":

Perhaps Derrida's deepest worry is that Heidegger's compulsion to gather and to resist at all costs dissemination and dispersion, even when such gathering paints itself in Heraclitean colors, is precisely what obscures Heidegger's perspective and inhibits his imagination and his empathy with regard to the others? (p. 128)

It is in this regard that with a light touch Krell draws together the strand of Derrida's criticism of gathering with that of the problem perennially preoccupying Heidegger's celebrity and, perhaps more now than ever, Heideggerean scholarship -- his detestable politics. While he draws on Derrida for caution against falling in with "the large contingent of Heidegger bashers and burners" (p. 116), he decries what he calls "Heidegger's frighteningly limited perspective on the destruction and the deaths of World War II", saying: "Where do we find in Heidegger's works a single passage in which he urges his students to visit the death camps, to develop an 'inner ear' for the suffering of others?" (p. 128). It is a failure that is deeply disturbing and difficult to understand.

Krell makes some effort to understand it here. He links it to Heidegger's concern with the curse of humanity's decomposition, and to his way of treating difference. The curse of humanity is not difference, but the discord among different nations and in an especially important sense the special importance of which is never codified, the two sexes. Heidegger's way clear of the curse is not the elimination of difference and the imposition of sameness and simplicity but a 'simple twofoldness' to which humanity can find its way by following the stranger, ahead of it on its own path. This idyllic view of a gathered, no longer fragmented, difference, "the gentleness of a onefold twofold" (from p. 62, quoting Unterwegs) surely has its appeal, and it is no doubt preferable to either discord or to simple homogeneity. But what disturbs Krell and Derrida is the elimination by gathering of a certain excess in distance to the other, and, what for them seems to be the same thing, the necessity of thinking the other in 'our language'. As long as the other is gentle, poses no threat, and does not resist being 'gathered' or being thought in a language and on a path that is 'our own', then Heidegger's attitude towards the other is pious. But if an other were to resist the gathering, to appear not as a gentle sister but as or in collaboration with the extreme danger of our epoch -- technology -- then the limits of Heidegger's ideal of a 'onefold twofold' are exceeded.

Technology and metaphysics are not the stranger that Heidegger exhorts us to follow. They are not even strange -- they describe our very own epoch and the way of talking and comporting that is most usual. And yet they pose a threat to thinking and the revealing of truth, and so require a form of antagonism that would tend towards something worryingly similar to purification (see p. 181n5). It is precisely the rigor of the distinctions Heidegger seems to draw between difference and the discord in difference; between other, stranger, and same; and which allow the other to be cast as a serene stranger and not as the technological leviathan that thinking opposes, that Krell wants to bring into question.

One of the most interesting and difficult questions raised by this book is: what if the plague of discord is difference, or at least is not dissociable from difference, not something introduced into difference, which can be drummed out again? If the elimination of discord from difference means the reduction of the differentness of difference, is it really just the recourse to a higher homogeneity? And if so, is an appeal to a higher homogeneity really dispensable? Such discord is impossible to make peace with. If, like Heidegger and Trakl, we regard ourselves as under "the curse of the decomposing Geschlecht" (pp. 61-62, quoting Unterwegs), then something must be done. If the technological-theoretical conceals being, then thinking cannot fail to destroy it. And yet, is a rigorous distinction of discord from a 'peace in difference', one that would allow us to distinguish between vanquishing the powerful and subjugating the weak, between defending and attacking, possible? Krell, following Derrida, identifies a pervasive polemicism that runs contrary to the programme of gathering and releasement that reveals it. The ideal of peace conceals an opposition to violence that can lend itself to the justification of highly unsettling purifications:

Heidegger's phenomenological training induces him to use the word lassen, 'letting,' the root of Gelassenheit, 'letting-be' or 'releasement'. . . . One must 'let' the things show themselves as they are, one must 'let' them come to the fore on their own, without doing them violence. And yet one must also clear away the obstacles, so that the things can appear. (p. 117)

This problem is aggravated because of the vulnerability of gathering and releasement. This peaceful drawing together of strangers is only possible if the strangers are peaceful also -- in the face of any opposition or sabotage gathering will fail, unless it can bring force to bear. In the chapter on "Heidegger's Ear: Philopolemology" Krell points to the idea of a Kampfgemeinschaft, an 'embattled community' that warrants defense: "the gathering power of the logos assumes a particularly disturbing form. . . . it is difficult to conceive of the plea for 'struggle' without the presence of a foe that confronts the Kampfgemeinschaft" (pp. 119-120). As long as the threat endangers the existence or continuation of releasement, and technology certainly does this, the thinking of being warrants protective measures, but by avoiding this polemical side of releasement no thought is given to rules of engagement or proportionality. This is a dangerous aversion because there is no force adequate to protect absolutely an essentially vulnerable virtue, and therefore no limit on the violence that can be marshaled in its service. What Krell calls Heidegger's desire to resist dissemination "at all costs" (p. 128) connects an otherwise beatific thinking of 'releasement' and a gentle relationship with the other to a violence that is neither acknowledged nor limited.

Bringing together the belief in a vulnerable gathering, an embattled community, and an aversion to discord is dangerous. If the protection of the vulnerable against discord has itself turned violent, it will have done so in a thinking that never developed the capacity to recognize violence, or to hold itself responsible for it. Whether the struggle is spiritual or actual, Krell's reservations raise a question absent from Heidegger's thinking: what is due to the foe? If the very existence of a 'foe' is denied, how can there be any rules governing its treatment?

Krell seems to want to respect the differences between the problems he discusses, and so there is little of the gathering them together that I have attempted in this review. While Derrida's way of introducing his Geschlecht project borrows Heidegger's own principle of situating -- "I wish to situate Geschlecht within Heidegger's path of thought"[14] -- Krell assiduously resists thematically situating his own book or its parts, either with respect to an overarching theme or to the history and current state of scholarship. While his reluctance to gather made it difficult for me to situate myself in the book, and while including more overview and signposting might have ameliorated some of this difficulty, Krell's seeming determination to resist any obfuscation of the differences between its various ideas is admirable and thought-provoking in itself. Imposing a more thematic and hierarchical structure, on either the book or the set of problems in it, would conceal what is in this case allowed to show itself. Connections weaker and more elusive than those of formal argumentative structures can then be examined and discussed, while ghosts that otherwise would not show themselves can be glimpsed. After my reading of this book, the twin phantoms of Heideggerean problems never addressed and Derridean texts never written will carry on haunting me.

[1] Martin Heidegger, "Language in the Poem," in On the Way to Language, trans. Peter D. Hertz (New York: Harper & Row, 1971).

[2] Jacques Derrida, "Geschlecht II: Heidegger's Hand," in Deconstruction and Philosophy: The Texts of Jacques Derrida, ed. John Sallis, trans. John P. Leavey (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1987), 161-96.

[3] Jacques Derrida, "Heidegger's Ear: Philopolemology (Geschlecht IV)," in Reading Heidegger: Commemorations, ed. John Sallis, trans. John P. Leavey, Studies in Continental Thought (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1993), 163-218.

[4] Jacques Derrida, "Geschlecht: Sexual Difference, Ontological Difference," Research in Phenomenology 13, no. 1 (1983): 65-83.

[5] Ibid.p. 65n.

[6] Ibid. p. 65.

[7] David Farrell Krell, "Schlag Der Liebe, Schlag Des Todes: on a Theme in Heidegger and Trakl," Research in Phenomenology 7, no. 1 (1977): 238-58.

[8] Derrida, "Geschlecht II: Heidegger's Hand."p. 191f.

[9] Martin Heidegger, Unterwegs zur Sprache, 13., Aufl (Stuttgart: Klett-Cotta, 2003), p. 46.

[10] Ibid.

[11] Martin Heidegger, "Words," in On the Way to Language, trans. Peter D. Hertz (New York: Harper & Row, 1971).

[12] Ibid.

[13] William McNeill, "Spirit's Living Hand," in Of Derrida, Heidegger, and Spirit, ed. David Wood (Evanston, Ill: Northwestern University Press, 1993), p. 113.

[14] Derrida, "Geschlecht: Sexual Difference, Ontological Difference,"p. 65n.