Hard Feelings: The Moral Psychology of Contempt

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Macalester Bell, Hard Feelings: The Moral Psychology of Contempt, Oxford University Press, 2013, 292pp., $49.95 (hardcover), ISBN 9780199794140.

Reviewed by Robert C. Roberts, Baylor University


Macalester Bell defends contempt as a moral emotion and recommends cultivating a disposition to feel apt contempt. She endorses a general account of emotions on which they are "cognitive" without implying belief or judgment of their content; rather, they are perception-like, "presenting" objects in one evaluative dimension or another. Contempt in particular has four salient properties. 1) It takes whole persons (rather than persons' actions or character traits) as its object; thus it is a "globalist" or "totalizing" evaluative perception of its target (usually some person or group, though institutions can also be contemned). 2) It is a "dismissive and insulting attitude that manifests disregard for its target" (8, italics original), presenting him or her as low in status by some standard of value that the subject cares about. 3) It is comparative or reflexive; "the contemnor makes a comparison between herself and the object of her contempt, and sees the contemned as inferior to her along some axis of comparison" (41). 4) Characteristically the subject shuns or withdraws from involvement with the object of contempt.

Bell clarifies the concept of contempt by comparing it with other hard feelings. Whereas contempt focuses on a person, attributes "badbeing," and motivates withdrawal, resentment focuses on an act, attributes wrongdoing, and motivates engagement with the target. Disgust is like contempt in presenting its object as "threatening" and motivating withdrawal, but it differs in often involving a somatic reaction, in not being hierarchical, comparative, and reflexive, and in construing its object as contaminated rather than low in status. Moral hatred differs from moral contempt in not being necessarily comparative and in motivating active engagement with the object rather than withdrawal. Bell also distinguishes active from passive contempt: whereas active contempt presents the target as "threatening," passive contempt hardly presents the target at all, regarding and treating the target as almost beneath notice. Most of the book is about active contempt, though it contains nice discussions of passive contempt as commended by Aristotle and Nietzsche. Bell also discusses Kant's discussion of contempt, and shows it to be surprisingly sympathetic to this emotion.

Bell lays down seven conditions (147-51) that "must be satisfied if a particular token of contempt is appropriate" (151). (I would add that a virtue of contempt will be a disposition to feel only contempt that meets these "aptness conditions.") The conditions are: 1) Your contempt must fit its target, that is, he must actually be contemptible in the way you perceive him to be. 2) Your reasons for feeling contempt must be morally defensible. For example, a racist's reasons (the racial features of the contemned) for contemning are morally indefensible. 3) You must have evidence for your reasons. If you contemn a politician for his arrogance, you need to have evidence that he is arrogant. 4) The fault for which you contemn someone must be serious. (I think this condition should be subsumed under 2).) 5) You must actually hold the values by reference to which you see the contemned as falling short (your contempt must not be hypocritical). 6) You must be responsive to reasons that support forsaking your contempt. (I think this condition should be subsumed under 3).) 7) Your contempt must be fair (for example, the target's despicable habits may be excused by his traumatic early childhood). (This condition too would seem to belong under 2).)

Each of the four main properties of contempt grounds a moral objection to it. 1) Since persons are never, or almost never, contemptible in every respect, contempt's globalist character condemns it to fail to fit its object: it (nearly) always misrepresents its target. 2) As a pungent kind of disrespect, contempt violates the moral claim of every human being to be respected for his or her basic human dignity. 3) Since human relationships are at their healthiest when the parties assume a basic equality among persons, the downward-looking comparative attitude of contempt impairs the contemnor's relationship with the contemned. 4) In motivating withdrawal or disengagement from its object, contempt forsakes a basic commitment of morality -- to stay engaged in communication with fellow agents.

Bell defends contempt against the first objection by pointing out that intelligent contempt construes the target as overall despicable because of some more special failing, which, among the target's traits, is so important as to redound to the disgrace of the whole person. If the globalist emotion takes such priorities among traits into account and does so by a correct prioritization, the emotion may be fitting. No doubt, contempt is often indiscriminate so that the subject of the emotion feels he must resist every evidence that the target has admirable qualities; but such contempt is not apt, even if the target deserves contempt. The indication that an instance of contempt is not irrational in this way is that it can withstand the honest assessment of such admirable qualities -- and perhaps even admire them. Bell points out that the discrimination in an apt globalist emotion is subject to rational criteria and can vary with the viewpoint of the emotional subject: the fittingness of a case of contempt can depend on the relationship between the subject and the person for whom he feels contempt. The insight that a globalist emotion can be discriminating is an advantage of the kind of "cognitive" view of emotions that she endorses. As I would understand it, what is most salient in the construal is the object's despicableness on account of the important trait, but that is not the whole of the construal's content, since the on account of consideration implies a certain qualification or limitation that allows for the admirable traits.

In response to the second objection, Bell appeals to Stephen Darwall's distinction between moral recognition respect -- the respect that is due every human being simply in virtue of his being a human agent, without regard to any of his particular traits or actions -- and appraisal respect -- the properly selective respect that is due to persons who have special kinds of merit: "contempt is not incompatible with recognition respect; there is no reason to suppose that the contemnor will, for example, always fail to acknowledge the moral or legal rights of those they con[t]emn" (171). This distinction will have to be effectively present in the emotional constitution of persons with a rational contempt disposition. Thus, persons with a trait of properly cultivated moral contempt will emotionally incorporate the distinction, so that when they feel globalist appraisal contempt for someone, it will have a background proviso, as it were, that the target is due moral recognition respect as a human agent. This may not always be a very salient feature of their experienced construal of the contemned, but it must be present in the perception and capable of tempering and coloring the contemptuous person's actions and deliberations.

Bell's answers to the third and fourth objections will emerge in connection with her account of the positive moral value of contempt, to which I now turn. She identifies a family of vices, the vices of superbia, which include arrogance, hypocrisy, and racism. All these vices centrally feature illicit contempt. Racism, for example, is contempt for people on the basis of their racial characteristics; arrogance is a disposition to claim false entitlements, to the disadvantage of others, on the basis of one's supposed or real superiority; hypocrisy is a pretense to moral superiority that one does not possess. Each of these attitudes is an illicit "put-down" of the "inferior" towards whom it is directed, and to the extent that expressions of these attitudes actually convince people or influence their perceptions -- both the direct victims and onlookers -- of the superiority of the superbic and the inferiority of their victims, they disrupt and corrupt the healthy human relationships of proper social order.

The main positive point of Bell's book is that apt contempt for the viciously contemptuous is the most effective, morally proper, and healthy way to turn the tables on them and correct the disordered social rankings that trail in their wake. Contempt is an irreplaceable dimension of a well-conceived moral psychology. A striking example of the positive value of contempt is the unfolding interaction between the arrogant Fitzwilliam Darcy and Elizabeth Bennet in Jane Austen's Pride and Prejudice. Elizabeth's contemptuous rejection of Darcy's offer of marriage precipitates his awareness and alarmed care about his moral defect, and its correction. He says to her, "What do I not owe you! You taught me a lesson, hard indeed at first, but most advantageous. By you, I was properly humbled." In this case, contempt's downward-looking comparative attitude (see objection 3) above) does not impair Elizabeth's relationship with Darcy, but makes a healthy relationship with him possible through correction of the perceived balance in their relative statuses. And this effect is brought about (see objection 4) above) by Elizabeth's contempt functioning as an act of communication: it is the way in which, intentionally or not, she "gets through" to Darcy. It functions not as a way of disengaging, but as a way of morally engaging him -- though it does this by initially shunning him. As Bell comments, apt contempt "helps put the target in a position to appreciate the reasons he has to change his ways" (225).

As I hope my reader can see from this exposition of Hard Feelings, it is a good book, very much worth reading, clearly written, challenging, and stimulating of much thought. Let me end this review by registering a few reservations about details.

Bell convinces me that contempt can be an apt response to the vices of superbia, or at any rate an aspect of an apt response to them. But she claims that it is the best response to them, and she limns contempt's contours in a way that marks it off a bit too starkly from other responses, especially the variants of anger (anger, resentment, indignation, outrage). She mentions humor a few times but devotes little analytic attention to it.

The other emotions can't compete with contempt for the poetic justice of combatting illicit contempt with apt contempt. Is contempt really as special as Bell claims? In my understanding, the emotions in the anger family are, like contempt, downward-looking. The angry person construes himself as sitting on the judgment seat, as it were, looking morally down on the culpable offender; anger, resentment, and indignation are judgmental emotions. (This is why convincingly featuring the angry person as guilty of the same delinquency as the offender tends to deflate his anger, and is part of the reason it feels so good to get angry at someone who has insulted you -- anger assuages shame.) Furthermore, anger and resentment are not, in some isolating way, just about wrongdoing, as Bell claims, but also about "badbeing": anger construes its object as bad, and contempt seems dirigible at actions -- at any rate, we speak of contemptible actions. A typical response to arrogance's illicit entitlement claim is an angry and skeptical "Who does he think he is?" Bell's excerpts from the abolitionists David Walker and Frederick Douglass on page 223 seem to me to express anger or outrage as much as contempt. They could be said to express angry contempt or contemptuous anger. Outrage and indignation preserve respect for the object by blaming, by construing him as a culpable and thus responsible agent; contempt as such does not. Pure contempt, unmixed with outrage or anger or indignation, is dehumanizing because it recognizes nothing valuable in its target. Frederick Douglass and Elizabeth Bennet pour contempt on their respective adversaries, but as blameworthy fellow agents. Thus, for full moral force, contempt seems to need to be combined and tempered with something in the neighborhood of anger.

Is contempt really the best response to the vices of superbia? Another emotion-like state that cuts the inapt contemnor down to size is humorous amusement. But unlike contempt and the anger family, amusement is not necessarily vitriolic. Even friendly amusement deflates the object in the subject's (and the object's and the onlookers') eyes, and so, among those whose ethics centers in the love of neighbor and enemy, may be preferable to its bitterer fellow emotions. The contemned who finds his contemnor mostly laughable is inoculated against the shame response, and communicates to the surrounding community that the vicious contemnor's program of dictating the pecking order is not to be taken seriously.

This last proposal, about meeting contempt with amusement, may evoke psychological skepticism: Wouldn't it take a person of extraordinarily developed character to counter the crushing disparagement of serious contempt with lighthearted benevolent laughter? I think the answer is Yes, this would be a person of unusual, and probably hard-won, character. But I think the same is true of Bell's most compelling examples. Elizabeth Bennet and Frederick Douglass are people of highly unusual moral formation. I would imagine that very few slaves were psychologically up to feeling withering and confident contempt for their white masters, and few young women can rise to such a height of construal as to shrivel the likes of a Darcy with the likes of Elizabeth's furious uncompromising contempt. A sequel to Macalester Bell's engaging book, which I hope she'll write, would address in detail the emotional features of the character who is best able to withstand and transcend the corrosive onslaught of the vices of superbia, and would explore the conditions and struggles that yield the growth of character in this dimension.