Hard Luck: How Luck Undermines Free Will and Moral Responsibility

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Neil Levy, Hard Luck: How Luck Undermines Free Will and Moral Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2011, 240pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199601387.

Reviewed by Andrew M. Bailey, Yale-NUS College


Determinism and its denial have played a central role in disputes about free will and moral responsibility. Each seems a threat to the claim that we are free or morally responsible. But there are other threats to our agency, some orthogonal to the truth of determinism. In this book, Levy develops one such threat in detail. As he puts it: "The causal structure of the universe is of little interest to me (here). It is not ontology that rules out free will, it is luck" (2).

To elaborate: it certainly seems as though some things are occasionally under our control. Accordingly, it certainly seems as though we can be fairly praised or blamed for those things. But if the hard luck view is correct, things aren't as they seem. We are, simply, subject to too much luck. Some of us do good; that is due to luck. Others do bad, but that too is due to luck. Thus, we are not in control nearly to the degree that one might otherwise expect. And thus -- because we are subjects of luck -- not one of us is, after all, morally responsible or free. This is the hard luck view, and it is the thesis of this book.


Chapter 1 introduces Levy's conception of moral responsibility, the hard luck view, and their central implications.

Chapter 2 offers an account of luck. Those who enjoy detailed and clever counterexamples will enjoy this chapter. So too will epistemologists (Levy's main interlocutors in this chapter are E.J. Coffman, Jennifer Lackey, and Duncan Pritchard). One upshot of Levy's account is that luck excludes control. Lackey has offered potential counterexamples to that thesis, and Levy has a reply. Though such examples involve luck in the ability to exercise control, they do not involve luck in exercising control (23). Levy also distinguishes between chancy and non-chancy luck (36). An event is lucky in the chancy way only if it fails to occur in many nearby possibilities (where the proportion of nearby possibilities that is large enough for the event to be lucky in the chancy way is inverse to the significance of the event for the agent).

Chapter 3 argues that indeterminism poses a problem of luck. One consequence is that libertarian views (according to which we are free and freedom requires indeterminism) of both the event-causal (44-63) and agent-causal (63-76) variety are doomed. The sorts of indeterminism required by either view introduce enough luck to exclude freedom. The arguments against event-causal and agent-causal views will be familiar to many readers. But Levy does suggest alternative forms of libertarianism that may yet be adequate. Oneclaims that free actions, though not determined, are nearly determined, and thus not lucky in the chancy way. Another claims that a merely local form of determinism obtains (between, say, a judgement and an intention). Levy is not impressed; these alternative libertarian views do not allow that we have sufficiently robust alternative possibilities (82). Here, Levy also offers an intriguing objection to John Martin Fischer's reply to the problem of luck (80-82). Fischer has claimed that Frankfurt-style cases can be adapted to reconcile moral responsibility with indeterminism. Levy's reply is that although Fischer's cases (like those offered in a quite different context by Lackey) involve luck in the ability to exercise control, they do not involve luck in exercising control.

Chapter 4 develops luck problems for compatibilist views. In particular, Levy argues that compatibilism conjoined with determinism poses a problem of luck (he doesn't say much about compatibilists who think that determinism is in fact false; presumably, the arguments of the previous chapter would apply to those views). The overall argument of this chapter is a dilemma ("luck pincer"), and it goes something like this. Distinguish between constitutive luck ("luck in the traits and dispositions that make one the kind of person one is") and present luck ("luck at or around a moment of choice"). Suppose compatibilism and determinism are both true. Then either our choices express our basic endowments or not. If they do, then our choices are constitutively lucky. If not, then other factors (each beyond our control) play too strong a role in the correct explanation of our choices, and so our choices are presently lucky. Either way, we are subject to luck of a kind that undermines free will and moral responsibility.

Chapters 5 and 6 offer arguments for the thesis that wrong actions are never blameworthy. Notably, these arguments are independent of both determinism and compatibilism. The main argument of Chapter 5 is that there is an epistemic condition on moral responsibility that always or nearly-always goes unsatisfied. In particular, someone can be appropriately blamed only if she believes alternatives were available to her and understands the significance of these alternatives (111). But since we do not exercise enough control over our beliefs (including those beliefs required by epistemic conditions on responsibility for action), we cannot be appropriately blamed for them, and so cannot be appropriately blamed for anything: "epistemic conditions on control are so demanding that they are rarely satisfied" (131). Levy notes that there may be a way out of this argument, viz., appeal to akraticaction: "voluntary and intentional action that conflicts with the agent's judgement about what it would be best to do" (135). Levy concedes that we might yet be blameworthy in general if akratic actions can be free or blameworthy. But akratic actions, he argues in Chapter 6, are not so situated, since akratic acts are the result of either "the overwhelming of their resources of self-control or through simple bad (present) luck" (156).

Chapter 7 and 8 conclude the book. In them, Levy argues that the problems of luck cannot be avoided by retreating to the "inner citadel" or to Quality of Will theories. Such retreats hold that what matters to someone's being morally responsible are certain of her intrinsic features (e.g., beliefs, desires, values) and whether her actions express those features. Levy objects that an agent's capacities matter too, and what capacities an agent has is not strictly a matter of her intrinsic features (Frankfurt-style cases show as much).

In the remainder of this review, I will briefly examine the central thesis of the book and discuss one broad avenue of objection to Levy's skeptical arguments.

Hard Luck

In the opening pages, Levy expresses the denial component of the hard luck view in at least three different ways:

a)     There is no such thing as free will

b)    No one has the ability to act so that she is morally responsible for her actions

c)     No one has the power to perform acts for which she deserves to be held praise- or blameworthy

Some will protest that these statements express three theses and not one. After all, isn't free will distinct from the ability to act in a morally responsible way? Couldn't someone be morally responsible (for the consequences of her actions, say) even if she's not responsible for her actions? And mightn't moral responsibility be distinct from the power to perform acts for which one is praise- or blameworthy? These are decent questions, picky as they may be. Fortunately, even though Levy isn't that interested in them, he is clear in at least this much: he affirms (a), (b), and (c).

Interestingly, Levy does not (usually) formulate the denial component of the hard luck view in modal terms. He does not (usually) claim that moral responsibility is impossible; rather, he says that no one is in fact morally responsible. Since many of the arguments in the book turn on empirical and contingent premises, this modal modesty seems appropriate. That said, in the first footnote of the book, Levy does insist that "free will is impossible" (2, emphasis added). One may wonder whether this modally loaded claim is supported by the arguments of the book, especially those that trade on empirical and contingent premises. But I don't think that worry should give Levy much pause. The thesis that no one is in fact morally responsible (even though someone could, in some remote possibility, be morally responsible) is startling enough.

What does the hard luck view imply? Are all the reactive attitudes irrational or inappropriate? Is all criminal punishment unjust? Levy has a precise, if controversial, answer to these questions: if the hard luck view is true, then "we never bring about, as a result of our deliberate actions, conditions under which we deserve to be treated as less (or more) thanequals in the consequentialist calculus" (4); "there are no desert-entailing differences between moral agents" (10). Later, he expands:

an agent who is morally responsible for a good action deserves a commensurate benefit on that basis; an agent who is morally responsible for a bad action deserves a commensurate burden. Benefits and burdens, in turn, are, [sic] to be understood in terms of differential treatment: to receive a benefit is to be treated better than other people who do not receive that benefit (in at least some respect), and to receive a burden is to be treated worse than others . . . Hence, moral responsibility is essentially linked to questions of distributive justice; not as the latter is usually understood -- in terms of the distribution of social goods, especially wealth -- but in terms of the distribution of benefits and burdens nonetheless. (194)

Are the Standards too High?

A reply to any argument for the thesis that no one is morally responsible for anything (and to skeptical arguments in other domains too) goes like this: "your standards are just too high; adopt a more modest conception of moral responsibility and its conditions, and you'll see that it is something we rather often enjoy". Levy has a reply. He is quick to claim that his conception of moral responsibility is modest; it is not of the heaven-or-hell variety famously discussed by Galen Strawson (3-5). Such a hyperbolic conception of moral responsibility requires a kind or degree of control no one could possibly enjoy. Accordingly, thinking we have such control amounts to little more than (in Fischer's apt words) "metaphysical megalomania". But, Levy says, his conception of moral responsibility isn't like thatHe's not concerned with heaven-or-hell desert; he is instead concerned with the fairness of differences in treatment not justified by a consequentialist calculus.

One way to test Levy's claim to modesty is to examine those conditions he takes as necessary for moral responsibility (or, if you like, as sufficient for non-responsibility). Just how robust are those conditions? Are they plausible? How compelling are the arguments offered on their behalf? I think reflection on these questions shows that there may yet be something to the charge that Levy's standards for moral responsibility are implausibly high. For example, consider Levy's assertion that moral responsibility is contrastive:

an agent is morally responsible for A-ing when she is responsible for A-ing rather than B-ing. If the explanation of the contrastive fact, that the agent A-ed rather than B-ed, essentially involves luck, then the agent is not responsible for the contrastive fact, and therefore not morally responsible at all, no matter how small the degree of moral responsibility in question. (34, fn 15; see also 51, fn 5)

These are striking claims, and worthy of more attention than their placement in footnotes would suggest. First, it's not clear why Levy presupposes a contrastive framework. That moral responsibility is contrastive is not an obvious consequence of Levy's conception of moral responsibility, after all. Why, exactly, couldn't one deserve differences in treatment for A-ing without deserving differences in treatment for A-ing rather than B-ing? One route to this contrastive framework runs through the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (according to which a person is morally responsible for what she has done only if she could have done otherwise). But (perhaps for good reason) Levy doesn't appeal to thisprinciple to motivate his contrastive framework. So why does he endorse the framework? To press the point, consider this toy theory-sketch:

There are contrastive facts about what agents do, and agents are morally responsible for these facts. But these facts are easy to explain; for contrastive facts are simple conjunctions. Jones did A rather than B if and only if (a) Jones did A and (b) Jones did not do B. (a) is explained by, say, Jones' reasons for A-ing. (b) is explained by (a) and the auxiliary hypothesis that A-ing is incompatible with B-ing. And we're done.


It's pretty clear that Levy thinks this toy theory-sketch just won't do. I imagine he'd reply that either the contrastive fact that Jones did A rather than B is not equivalent to the conjunction of (a) and (b), or that on this toy theory (a) or (b) go unexplained. The toy theory is just too deflationary about contrastive facts or about what it takes to explain such. But one wonders why; and Levy has little to say on the matter.[1]

Second, Levy seems to here presuppose that every contrastive fact has some (or perhaps even exactly one; note his use of the definite article) explanation. But absent the Principle of Sufficient Reason or some close cousin, it's not obvious why one should accept this presupposition. What would be helpful here is a systematic metaphysical picture (or at least a sketch of one).

To be fair, Levy briefly touches on these questions later in the book. He says

that direct moral responsibility is moral responsibility for a choice between options of conflicting moral valence entails that an adequate account of moral responsibility must have the resources to explain choices contrastively. It is not enough to offer an explanation of why the agent chose as she did, if we leave unexplained why she chose one option and not another. (43)

Levy then claims that (in indeterministic cases, at least) the only candidate explanations (of why an agent did A rather than B, say) are facts that obtain at a time subsequent to that agent's A-ing, and that such facts cannot explain the agent's A-ing. Those facts come late in the game, as it were. Intriguing as it may be, this argument raises yet more questions. Why can't facts that obtain after a decision contribute to an explanation (whether contrastive or not) of that decision? Is there a ban on backwards explanation in general? Some views in metaphysics (such as presentism) may vindicate such a ban, but absent such a view, it is not clear why one should accept the ban.[2] Again, a more systematic metaphysical picture would be helpful here -- for both understanding and motivating Levy's arguments. Absent that picture, it is unclear why one should accept a contrastivitycondition on moral responsibility, and whether Levy can avoid the charge of having standards that are just too high.


This is a challenging book. Most readers will, I expect, reject its conclusions. Such is philosophy. But it's often tricky to say where the arguments go wrong. That's a sign that Levy is onto something interesting. This book will be of interest to all those who work on free will or moral responsibility. It is an important contribution to the growing literature on threats to free will and moral responsibility beyond those posed by determinism. It would be a fine focal text for an upper-division undergraduate or graduate seminar, especially when paired with Alfred Mele's recent (and much more optimistic) Free Will and Luck.

Non-specialists, too, will find something of value here. Epistemologists, in particular, will find Levy's account of luck in Chapter 2 interesting and provocative.[3]

[1] The issues raised here are not local to debates about agency (they turn on much more general questions about explanation); nor are they new (as students of early modern rationalism will no doubt observe). See, e.g., Alexander Pruss' The Principle of Sufficient Reason (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006): 148ff.

[2] Indeed, there may be compelling reasons to reject the ban. See Allan Hazlett's "How the past depends on the future" Ratio 24 (2):167-175 (2011).

[3] Thanks to Brad Rettler, Alex Skiles, and the JMF Guild for comments.