Hard Questions: Facing the Problems of Life

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John Kekes, Hard Questions: Facing the Problems of Life, Oxford University Press, 2019, 306pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190919986.

Reviewed by Garrett Cullity, The University of Adelaide


In writing this book, John Kekes sets himself a hard task. His aim is to address ten very broad ethical questions -- the hard questions of his title -- in a way that illuminates them for philosophers, advanced students and reflective non-philosophers alike. The questions, each of which has its own chapter, are: Is there an absolute value that overrides all other considerations? Must we conform to prevailing conventions? Do we owe what our country asks of us? Must justice be done at all costs? How should we respond to evil? Should we forgive wrong actions? Does shame make life better or worse? Is it always good to be true to who we are? Do good intentions justify bad actions? and Are moral values the highest of all values? He answers No to the first, last and fourth (Must justice be done at all costs?). The answer to all the others is: It depends.

Kekes offers two main criteria for what makes his hard questions hard. The one he emphasizes most often is that they unavoidably give rise to reasonable answers that conflict with each other, and the right answer is context-dependent (p. 293). The other is that hard questions force choices in which whatever we do requires giving up something important to us (2). The questions are hard both because the answers are not easy to find and have to be re-found in each new context, and because committing oneself to an answer is rightly experienced as an identity-challenging wrench. What makes Kekes's task in discussing them hard, I would add, is that the generality of his intended audience imposes some tight constraints. Given his contextualism and pluralism, he is unable to provide one-size-fits-all answers to his questions (except for the three one-size-fits-all questions to which he answers No -- these don't meet his description of hard questions, but we should let that pass: they get a consistent contextualist treatment along with the rest). Instead, his answer each time has to be: It depends. The value of the book then relies on how well it can deal with the obvious next question: "It depends on what?" Kekes is not just a contextualist but an anti-theorist: he denies that there is a general theory by reference to which the contextual variability of ethics can be explained. So the challenge is to find a way of addressing each of his questions that is informative and digestible but contextually nuanced, without losing his readers in a forest of detailed distinctions.

His solution to this challenge is to structure each chapter around a pair of examples sourced from fiction, history, biography and anthropology, illustrating people who give different answers to the target question, and then critically examining the answers for their contextual adequacy. Thus, the chapter on political obedience contrasts a kamikaze pilot and a Vietnam draft-avoider; the chapter on forgiveness sets Captain Vere from Melville's Billy Budd against Albert Speer; the chapter on the overridingness of morality juxtaposes Cato the Younger and Montaigne. The idea is to draw on the force of the examples to support the contextualism, while also making it compelling that there is a right answer in each particular case, but that it need not coincide with the decision that was actually reached -- it's possible to get it wrong. By appreciating what made the decisions in the examples better or worse, we are supposed to be helped to appreciate how we, the readers, might arrive at better answers to the same questions in our own contexts.

This approach has a good deal to recommend it. His questions are amongst those that bring us to philosophy for answers; when they are phrased this generally, the answers are indeed, "It depends"; and a non-technical book needs to be illustrative, engaging and direct, so his example-driven, comparative approach makes good sense.

The project is a worthy one. However, the execution is problematic, in three main ways. One kind of problem comes from idiosyncratic readings of the philosophical issues under discussion. The topic of the chapter on forgiveness, for example, turns out to be whether someone should be "blamed or forgiven" for an action of a type that is normally wrong -- we get this argument: "if there is no reasonable justification or excuse for it, then the action really is morally or otherwise wrong, its wrongdoer is reasonably blamed for doing it, and forgiveness is out of place." (160) Accordingly, what gets discussed is whether the performance of an action of a type that is normally wrong really was blameworthy or not. But the focus of most discussions of forgiveness is different: what they are asking is when, after having been treated in a way that really was blameworthy, a victim of wrongdoing should subsequently forgive the wrongdoer. I would have thought that this is the question about forgiveness that a reflective person wanting guidance from philosophy is asking too.

That kind of problem is less important than a second one: conclusions are reached and rival views dismissed too quickly. When all due allowance is made for the fact that this book is intended for a general readership, it is hard to see what is gained (in the chapter on good intentions) by quoting Kant on the unconditional goodness of the good will and Mill on the Greatest Happiness Principle, then sweeping both aside in a single sentence, on the grounds that "they do not take into account that beliefs -- both about the goodness of an act of will and about what promotes the greatest happiness -- are often misled by ideological or personal identifications." (250) If they can be refuted this easily, it is hard to see why they are worth engaging with at all. The chapter on being true to oneself offers an even brisker one-sentence treatment of five philosophers: "The fine philosophers listed below who attribute crucial importance to being true to who we are have not recognized that we may be true to the fanatical, greedy, irrational, power-hungry, stupid, or vicious person we are" -- this is followed by a footnote listing books by Frankfurt, Korsgaard, Schneewind, Taylor and Williams (231). Could they really qualify as fine philosophers if they have not realized that?

It is not just the negative moves that are made too swiftly; the positive ones are as well. Each chapter ends with a section titled "The Answer" in which, unsurprisingly, we are told that this is context-dependent. The challenge is then to provide some informative general conclusion concerning which features of the context it depends on. Occasionally Kekes ducks this challenge -- for example, the chapter on responding to evil simply concludes by redescribing the responses of the two fictional characters who feature earlier in the chapter: a Holocaust survivor who overcomes her terrible trauma to live a fulfilling life, and a priest whose faith is shaken by knowing what was done to her. But to his credit, he usually does try to meet this challenge, telling us which features of the context he thinks the answer will depend on. These conclusions are rarely obvious, though: they include that whether you should conform with prevailing conventions depends on whether this helps you to live as you think you should (67); that you are obligated to obey the state up to the point at which it becomes incompatible with your autonomy (96); that whether you should be true to who you are depends on how dissatisfied you are with who you are (236); and that you should only forgive a wrongdoer if they considered the alternatives to their action beforehand (183). So we need to know: why reach these answers rather than different ones? And how does the comparative method help us to reach them?

This remains unclear. Take the first of those conclusions: it is a surprising alternative to the simpler claim that whether you should conform with prevailing conventions depends on whether this helps you to live as you should, not as you think you should. Why draw the more subjective conclusion? It comes at the end of a chapter that contrasts Melville's Bartleby the Scrivener (a passive nonconformist) with Paolo Sarpi (a self-protective surface conformist). But how do those examples encourage the more subjective view? What Kekes ends up providing as support for it is the passage from Montaigne's famous essay on solitude where he recommends that we "reserve a back shop all our own, entirely free, in which we establish our real liberty and our principal retreat". But this just endorses Sarpi's way of dealing with the world: it does not help to show why what we should be seeking to protect in the security of our back shop is the ability to live as we think we should, rather than as we really should.

To some of the questions, more ambitious answers are attempted. The chapter on justice maintains that justice can conflict with other values, and sensibly asks how we are to evaluate the reasons for and against different ways of resolving such conflicts. The concluding proposal is that we can do this "from the point of view of whether [the contrary reasons] strengthen or weaken the entire evaluative framework on which all of us who live together in a context depend." (123) But this is obscure. What is it for contrary reasons to strengthen or weaken an entire evaluative framework? And how can this be applied to the question of whether justice should be done, by a particular person, in a particular context -- where the implications of my individual action for the strengthening or weakening of an entire evaluative framework are rarely in question?

However, it is with the questions themselves, rather than the swiftness of the conclusions that are drawn about them, that the third and biggest problem with the book lies. There is a prior "It depends" response to Kekes's questions that should be made before we get to issues of context-dependency. The right answers to give to his questions depend on exactly what is being asked in each case. Too often, the discussion shifts between different readings of its headline questions, in a clarity-defeating way. For example, the question whether there is an absolute value turns into whether we should make an unconditional commitment to what we take to be the absolute value (22). The question whether justice must be done at all costs morphs into "Is justice necessary?" and then is answered by maintaining that if justice were necessary, we could not live without it (121). The question whether good intentions justify bad actions is pursued by describing an NKVD gulag boss who mistakenly but genuinely believed his intentions were good (242). The question about forgiveness, as we saw, is interpreted as a question about whether an action really was blameworthy -- but then forgiveness is also described as treating people more leniently than they deserve (181). While a book of this kind has to avoid pedantic distinctions, the most important service that philosophy can give to practical thought is to dispel confusion and provide clarity. For this, attention to detail matters: here, there is an unfortunate impression of haste throughout. There are unusually many typos, and some odd misattributions. Michael Tooley is described as a theist (137).

So I think Kekes is defeated by his hard task. However, I imagine I would be too. He errs in the direction of being too freewheeling; I would probably fail in the opposite way, by being too careful and boring. The difficulty of the task does not mean it should not be attempted. On the contrary: efforts such as this should be more common than they are. Moral philosophy should aim to speak illuminatingly to any morally serious person, in a way that connects our own moral predicaments to those faced by reflective people across time, culture and circumstance. Future attempts to do so will need to improve on this one, but they would do well to consider what Kekes is attempting, with his example-driven approach. And given the hardness of the task, maybe the best we will be able to do will fall short. How do we devise a moral philosophy that is fully lucid, accessible, and correct? Perhaps, as I'm afraid Kekes does say at one point, "the question remains to be unanswered".