Hard Truths

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Elijah Millgram, Hard Truths, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 301pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405188159.

Reviewed by Michael P. Lynch, University of Connecticut



Philosophical tradition — or at least one philosophical tradition — has it that all truth is what Elijah Millgram, in this provocative new study, calls “hard truth”. That is, if a proposition is true, it is flatly true, and if it is false, then it is flatly false. This is one form of what is generally called the principle of bivalence. The same tradition associates with another: such hard truth is what is preserved in valid inference. Valid arguments are such that if the premises are hard (flatly) true, then the conclusion must be too.

Over the past few decades, these truisms have been subjected to a number of attacks. Bivalence has been the target of Dummettian antirealists and some theories of vagueness, for example, while the idea that truth is what is preserved by valid inference has been thought by some to be undone by considerations stemming from the semantic paradoxes. On the surface then, a book like this one — which argues against both truisms — is covering well-trodden ground.

In point of fact, however, Millgram’s book presents entirely different and original arguments against the traditional view that all truth is hard truth. Moreover, Millgram’s claim is not just that the truisms are wrong (or wrong enough — more on this in a moment); they are essential components of a deeply flawed picture of metaphysics and philosophy. That picture portrays the world and its contents as crystal-clean and neatly divided, and our thinking as deserving cognitive praise only when it mirrors the structure of that world. A consequence of Millgram’s arguments, were they successful, would then be that we would abandon much of this picture. We must instead see the world as “messy” and most of our thinking and reasoning as being aimed at what is partially true. The book is therefore self-consciously ambitious in a way that few philosophy books are anymore. If he is right, Millgram announces, then “the approaches taken in a number of philosophical specializations — theory of truth, philosophical logic, metaphysics, and incidentally, epistemology, are deeply misguided” (p. 12).

Hard Truths is divided into four parts. The first part motivates the thesis that we must give up on the ideas that all (or even very much) truth is hard truth. The second provides two transcendental arguments for this conclusion, the third examines some competing views emerging out of the vagueness literature, and the fourth applies Millgram’s view of partial truth to some central metaphysical debates. The main text of the book is remarkably accessibly written, with plenty of examples and with relatively little jargon. (An unfortunate consequence of this accessibility however, is that a good deal of more technical argument is confined to the voluminous — 75 pages worth! — notes sorted in the back by chapter alone; the reader interested in such asides will find him or herself flipping the pages quite a bit.) In what follows, I’ll concentrate my remarks on some of the positive theses and their consequences.

In Millgram’s view, most domains of thought are not bivalent. Their component statements are not hard true, but at best, partially true. One line of argument Millgram develops for this conclusion goes roughly like this. In order to reason about how the world is, we must construct arguments whose elements “interlock” — or support each other; p interlocks or “matches” the antecedent of p implies q, so I can deduce q. But for practical reasons, I must sometimes force premises to “match” even when they do so only partially: “Our cognitive budget is limited, and so when the world is messy, we have no alternative … to keeping the number of tools down to what we can carry, by being willing to improvise with what we have” (59). To say the world is messy means that it is “resistant to pigeonholing” in a variety of ways. That resistance can be overcome, Millgram thinks, but it doesn’t come easy. It must be earned — or more exactly, where bivalence holds, it holds generally because we have engineered things to make it so. The “things” we’ve engineered are not just our concepts. Our concepts change because we change the world in some way. One example: during much of humanity’s history, our time-keeping concepts were imprecise; practical needs led to the invention of clocks, and consequently, the relevant concepts become more precise and the truths we state with them become much less partial. A second example: courts are there to make decisions, to say who has the claim and who does not. So we have set up legal procedures so that statements of law are subject to bivalence. In short, we don’t generally reason by way of hard truth because making our concepts precise is hard work. It has costs, so we do it (or should do it) only when there is a real pay off — when the costs involved are outweighed by the benefits of being able to engage in straightforward deductive reasoning in the domain. (Millgram wisely concedes that we don’t engineer the bivalent laws of physics and mathematics. Nonetheless he argues that even here, our applications of those laws have costs — we need to work hard to make the data come out in a way that fits the laws precisely, and often we don’t succeed.)

So, mathematics and the hard sciences aside, bivalence holds sway mostly in “artifactual” domains — domains where, by fooling with the subject matter, we’ve made it hold. Thus many of our thoughts are not hard true; most are partially true. This has two immediate consequences. The first is that, since in Millgram’s view, deductive inference presupposes bivalence, few of our inferences are deductive (p. 28). Instead, they involve inferences that go from premises that are partially true to conclusions that are partially true. The second is that, since belief is aimed at hard truth, we believe much less than philosophers think we do. Instead, we hold a variety of commitments that are “inferentially restricted” — that is, we impose constraints of various sorts on the inferences we can draw from our commitments to partial truths (p. 108-109).

What is partial truth? Millgram argues that we cannot give an answer that is both general and formal (p. 45). The reason is that the partial truth is “heterogeneous … including approximations, idealizations, vagueness, representations that are — a bivalentist will want to say — useful but false, and much else besides” (p. 135). In short, there are too many ways of being partially true. We can give formal accounts of some of these phenomena, but we can’t say much about the whole. We can say that “partial truth is the formal object of the mental states deployed in partial truth inference” — mental states for which Millgram thinks we often lack ordinary names (p. 110). We can also say that partially true statements must fit the world to some degree (p. 109). But we can’t give a general theory because of the plurality of ways of being partially true.

So why think we are dealing with one phenomenon? He argues that, like various forms of vagueness, the various ways our statements can be partially true are “usefully thought about together” (p. 135). But why, exactly? One natural suggestion is that the ways of being partially true are unified just because they are all ways of being partially true. If this is to be helpful, however, it presumably must piggyback on a particular understanding of truth — something Millgram demures from supplying. This is not to say that he says nothing: “To take a sentence to be fully true (to believe it) is to be committed to all of the conclusions that follow from it” (p. 40). Thus to take a sentence to be partially true is to be committed to only some of those conclusions. This tells us that part of the point of our truth concept is to act as a guide for inference. But it doesn’t tell us what truth itself is — what, if anything, makes a sentence either true or partially true. It is not clear that we can make much headway in thinking about whether partial truth is a sort of truth without an answer to that question.

This is all the more surprising because, in one my favorite parts of the book, he rejects deflationism as being a good theory of how philosophers have come to think about truth, as opposed to truth itself. Since deflationism’s central tenet is that there is nothing to say about the metaphysics of truth in general — there is nothing that “makes” sentences true in general — one wonders how antideflationary Millgram’s account really is. One possibility is that Millgram is a pluralist: just as there are many ways for sentences to be partially true, there are many ways for a sentence to be true. Indeed, this seems natural, since it seems he is already committed to a form of logical pluralism: "’The logic of partial truth’ is a failed definite description, because there are different formal treatments suitable for differing subject matters and applications" (p. 145). Of course this raises its own questions: if different subject matters are governed by different logics (different consequence relations), then how do we reason across those subjects? What is the logic that governs our generalizations and inferences across partial truths of different varieties?

As I noted above, Millgram argues that if his view of partial truth is correct, then deductive logic is less central to our reasoning than we generally assume. By “deductive logic” he presumably means “classical deductive logic”. But if partial truth is understood as, say, “inferentially restricted” truth, then we are still placing hard truth (and therefore classical logic) at the center and abstracting our understanding of partial truth from that. (Contrast another approach: we define truth as coherence, take it that coherence can range from perfect to imperfect, and then adopt a non-classical multi-valued logic that applies universally). One might have similar doubts about whether the other consequence I mentioned follows as well. That was the idea that if partial truth is as common as Millgram argues, then we must give up on what Millgram calls “belief-psychology”. I’m not so sure. After all, we do have a notion of “degrees of belief”, and while this concept is often taken to be something of an abstraction itself in probability theory, one might well think that, just from ordinary language, one can believe something more or less. If we can help ourselves to such a notion, then perhaps it is that idea we should be focusing on, and not partial truth. That is, perhaps all truths are hard truths, but for practical reasons of the sort that Millgram has outlined, we must get along in the world by only partially believing what is fully true.

This is a difficult book to categorize. Its scope is extremely wide, and the book is crammed with material I haven’t been able to touch on here — including an argument from the unity of the self, a discussion of contextualist views on vagueness, and a sustained attack on contemporary metaphysics’ notions of ontological commitment. Moreover, Millgram, as he often playfully reminds the reader, writes the book from — what else? — his own “partial truth” philosophical standpoint (e.g., p. 110). As a consequence, the book is in equal parts provocative, inspiring and frustrating to someone who doesn’t share that standpoint. Hard Truths is not a analysis of truth and indeterminacy in the familiar style. It is a challenge to orthodoxy and an original take on the nature of human rationality.