Hate Speech Law: A Philosophical Examination

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Alexander Brown, Hate Speech Law: A Philosophical Examination, Routledge, 2015, 362pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415885478.

Reviewed by Mary Kate McGowan, Wellesley College


Hate speech is a highly contested category of speech, rich with philosophical complexity and controversy. Hate speech is difficult to define; its harms are contested and its free speech status disputed. In his book, Alexander Brown investigates various potential justifications for various types of legal regulation of various types of hate speech.

These multiplicities are one of his themes. There are many different sorts of arguments offered to justify (or prohibit) the regulation of hate speech, and they rely on different values, assumptions and principles. Moreover, some arguments are better suited to certain types of hate speech regulation and/or the justification of the regulation (or the prohibition of the regulation) of certain types of hate speech. Brown is absolutely right about this and he is right to stress it. His book will have an impact and improve the quality of debates about hate speech and its regulation by making these multiplicities more widely recognized.

Another main claim of the book is that some clusters of hate speech regulation are warranted with respect to certain principles. In Chapter 3, for example, Brown argues that the regulation of some hate speech is justified with respect to what he calls the Nuanced Principle of Autonomy. In Chapter 4, he argues that some campus speech codes are warranted with respect to what he calls the Nuanced Principle of Truth. Although Brown argues that some clusters of hate speech regulation are warranted with respect to certain principles (or set of principles), he does not (even try to) argue that any clusters of hate speech regulation are warranted with respect to all (36 of) the principles he considers, nor does he say which principles are the right ones. Thus, those readers who want to know whether any hate speech law is warranted (full stop) will have to look elsewhere.

The book is admirably broad in its scope. It considers hate speech regulations from all around the globe, viewpoints from all across the political spectrum and arguments from theorists in a variety of fields. This breadth, however, comes at certain costs. Much of the book is descriptive (describing the terrain, who said what and what could be said on behalf of some point) and the evaluative parts of the book are, and indeed must be, quite truncated. As a result, some incredibly complex issues are given extremely brief treatment (e.g., use of the n-word gets a paragraph on p. 168). Of course, given the extremely ambitious nature of the project, some such limitations are inevitable.

In the "Introduction", Brown states his main aims: to identify various principled arguments both for and against the regulation of hate speech, to identify different sorts of hate speech regulation, law and code (henceforth I will just say 'regulation') and to offer a theory of how principled conflicts ought to be adjudicated.

In Chapter 2 ("Ten Clusters of Laws/Regulations/Codes That Constrain Uses of Hate Speech"), Brown identifies ten (idealized clusters) of hate speech regulation: group defamation, negative stereotyping or stigmatization, the expression of hatred, incitement to hatred, threats to public order, denial laws, dignitary crimes or torts, violation of civil or human rights, expression-oriented hate crimes, and time, place and manner restrictions. He stresses that actual regulations can fall into more than one cluster and some of these regulations do not target hate speech per se (e.g., time, place, and manner restrictions) but are included here since they can be used to regulate instances of hate speech.

Chapter 3 ("Principles of Basic Morality") considers (basic) moral principles and their bearing on hate speech regulation. Here the focus is on health, autonomy, security, non-subordination, absence of oppression, and human dignity. Brown argues that some hate speech regulations are warranted with respect to his Nuanced Principle of Autonomy. He also argues that if theorists can show that hate speech has the authority to subordinate, then the regulation of that (subordinating) hate speech would be warranted with respect to what he calls the Principle of Non-Subordination. He concludes by stressing that the overall warrant of these regulations must be weighed against free speech protecting principles.

In Chapter 4 ("Principles of Personal Development"), Brown turns to some of these free speech protecting principles. Here his focus is on the discovery of truth, the acquisition of knowledge, self-realization, and human excellence. He argues that although many believe that these principles of personal development require unrestricted freedom of expression, on closer inspection and once specifics are considered, some of these principles actually favor the regulation of (some) hate speech. This is because the personal development of those targeted by hate speech favor it.

Chapter 5 ("Principles of Civic Morality") is primarily concerned with and critical of Jeremy Waldron's recent work on hate speech. Brown takes Waldron to task for not supporting Holocaust denial laws and for being "too hasty in de-emphasizing civil proceedings in protecting the civic dignity of vulnerable groups" (147-148). Brown also questions the necessity of hate speech regulation for public assurance (one of Waldron's public goods), and worries that Waldron's view would exclude infants, some disabled adults, and residents who are non-citizens from protection.

In Chapter 6 ("Principles of Cultural Diversity"), Brown argues that the aim of maintaining cultures cuts both ways with respect to hate speech regulation. Focusing mostly on the work of Charles Taylor and Bhikhu Parekh, he argues that since cultural diversity can be undermined by cross burning and Holocaust denial, regulating these actions can be warranted with respect to what he calls the Nuanced Principle of Culture. The Principle of Recognition supports an "array of hate speech regulation" and the Principle of Intercultural Dialogue supports a variety of media-related restrictions (including limiting the use of negative stereotypes about protected groups).

Chapter 7 ("Principles of Political Morality") focuses on distinctively political principles (e.g. democratic self-government, political legitimacy, and citizens as legal subjects) that might be used in arguments for or against hate speech regulation. He argues that, although it may seem that these principles require unrestricted freedom of expression, on closer inspection it can be shown that each of these political principles supports some sorts of restrictions on some sorts of hate speech.

In Chapter 8 ("Principles of Balance") Brown considers two types of balancing approaches that might be used to adjudicate cases where some principles favor regulation and others prohibit it. In particular, he considers interest balancing and rights balancing. He argues that interest balancing is basic but faces an insurmountable challenge of incommensurability. (Brown's alternative theory is developed in Chapter 10.)

Chapter 9 ("Principia Juris") explores legal principles that might be used for or against hate speech regulation. The principles in question are the Principle of Pressing Social Need, the Principle of Efficacy, the Precautionary Principle, the Principle of the Least Restrictive Alternative, the Principle of Narrow Tailoring, the Principle of Overbreadth, the Principle of Vagueness, and the Principle of Neutrality. The main point here is that although these legal principles present a hurdle for hate speech regulation, that hurdle is not insurmountable since many jurisdictions that embrace these principles nevertheless have enacted hate speech regulation.

In Chapter 10 ("Toward a Theory of Principled Compromise"), Brown offers his theory for how principled disputes over hate speech regulation should be adjudicated by the courts. He argues for a process of substitution compromise where conflicting principles are replaced by nuanced middling principles. Brown also argues that two important U.S. Supreme Court cross burning cases (R.A.V v. City of St. Paul and Virginia v. Black) can be read as instances of this substitution compromise method.

The book covers an enormous amount of ground, and Brown culls huge literatures in assembling this vast array of principled arguments both for and against hate speech regulation. Theorists from an array of fields and viewpoints are brought into direct contact with one another and separate but related literatures are here helpfully united. In this way, his book does a real service to the discussion and will be an indispensable contribution to illuminating the vast array of regulations, relevant principles, arguments and types of hate speech.

As mentioned above, Brown does not argue that (any) hate speech regulation is warranted (full stop). Instead, he offers the helpful notion of N-warrant: a relative sort of justification. A regulation is N-warranted relative to a certain set of normative principles. So, for example, Brown argues in Chapter 3 that some hate speech regulation is N-warranted with respect to his Principle of Non-subordination. My main concern is that such claims of N-warrant have little traction in the absence of a framework for thinking about free speech issues more generally and the book does not provide any such framework. Consider the various issues involved with the philosophical foundations of a free speech principle. What is a principle of free speech exactly? Is it a moral, political or legal principle? What does it do exactly? How does it protect speech and what exactly counts as speech? What justifies extending these special (free speech) protections to speech? What precisely is required to justify the regulation of some category of speech so that the regulation in question is consistent with the relevant free speech principle? My worry is that unless the reader knows how to connect the normative principles N-warranting the regulation in question to these broader questions, the reader is unable to assess the import of Brown's claim of N-warrant. In particular, without a way to connect his Principle of Non-subordination to a broader free speech framework, it is pretty unclear what to make of his claim that this principle N-warrants certain clusters of hate speech regulation. Thus, when assessing Brown's various arguments for and against hate speech regulation, it would be helpful for the reader to have additional information about a free speech principle more generally.

Brown makes many helpful distinctions, but I think he ought to make even more. After all, his various principles are doing very different justificatory work. One issue concerns what justifies a principle of free speech. What is so valuable about speech that we are warranted in protecting it via a principle of free speech? Some of Brown's principles (e.g., Nuanced Principle of Truth, Nuanced Principle of Autonomy) seem to be concerned with this justificatory question. A different justificatory question (related but distinct) concerns the justification for regulating (or prohibiting the regulation of) a certain category of speech. Some of Brown's other principles (e.g., Principle of Non-oppression, Principle of Non-subordination) seem to be concerned with this (harm-prevention) question. Yet another issue concerns conditions that regulations themselves must meet. Once a particular category of speech is shown to be harmful enough to warrant regulation (in whichever free speech or legal system is at issue), there are further conditions on any proposed regulations. Most of the principles identified in Chapter 9 are concerned with this quite separate issue.

Furthermore, even once we limit ourselves to justifications for regulating (or prohibiting the regulation of) some particular category of speech, there are still a variety of different sorts of justification at play. It is one thing to show why regulating hate speech is warranted (or not) given certain moral, philosophical or political principles but it is quite another thing to justify a particular bit of legislation within a particular legal system. Brown moves seamlessly between them all (his theory of principled compromise concerns only judicial decisions), but I think he should help the reader more in keeping them distinct.

Being explicit on these issues would help the reader, but I think being more explicit (especially about his methodology) would also help Brown. To see this, consider the following. In assembling all of these arguments for and against the regulation of hate speech, Brown is bringing a wide variety of theorists into contact with one another, and there are important differences between these theorists. They have different projects, assumptions, methods and questions. Some are talking about different legal systems, and different places have different ideas about the role of government. Some theorists aren't talking about any actual legal system at all but rather about that free speech system that that theorist argues that we ought to have. Some are offering legal arguments; others are offering more theoretical ones. Different theorists are interested in the different justificatory questions discussed above. Despite all of this diversity, Brown brings them all into contact but without flagging these differences, and one might think that doing so is insufficiently careful and/or unfair. This is a mistake. Brown is not here trying to adjudicate every free speech debate out there. Instead, he is borrowing threads of argumentation from various fields and literatures in order to assemble a vast array of arguments both for and against hate speech regulation. He then assesses the arguments he constructs; he is not assessing the work of the theorists from whom he borrows, at least not on their own terms. I think Brown should be clearer on this point.

In sum, Brown presents and evaluates a wide variety of arguments both for and against the regulation of hate speech. Along the way, many interesting laws, cases and decisions are discussed and the reader will find this book to be a very helpful source for hate speech case law. Brown is absolutely right to emphasize the plurality of types of regulation, argumentation and hate speech; he is also spot on in stressing that different arguments are better suited to different types of regulation and/or hate speech. The book also brings disparate literatures into fruitful contact. For these reasons, I definitely recommend it.