The Beginning of Western Philosophy: Interpretation of Anaximander and Parmenides

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Martin Heidegger, The Beginning of Western Philosophy: Interpretation of Anaximander and Parmenides, Richard Rojcewicz (tr.), Indiana University Press, 2015, 219pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253015532.

Reviewed by William McNeill, DePaul University


"Our mission: the cessation of philosophizing?" With this provocative suggestion, Heidegger opens his lectures on Anaximander and Parmenides, delivered at the University of Freiburg in the summer semester of 1932. Published as volume 35 of the Gesamtausgabe (Complete Edition), these lectures offer an invaluable aid in filling out our understanding of the complicated transition that Heidegger's thought undergoes between Being and Time (1927) and Introduction to Metaphysics (1935), as well as the subsequent path of the "history of being" (or "history of beyng," as it frequently appears, using the archaic Seyn instead of Sein) and the "event" (Ereignis). That these lectures of 1932 indeed constitute a pivotal moment in the transition toward the later project is indicated by Heidegger in a remark in the Appendix of Mindfulness (1938/39), in which he comments that "Since early 1932 the fundamental features were established of that plan which acquires its initial configuration in the projection Of the Event" -- the latter referring to the Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event) from 1936-38.[1] The configuration referred to is articulated around the distinction between a "first beginning" and an "other beginning." The 1932 lectures are a sustained effort to understand the original, first beginning of Western philosophy through an interpretation of two of its earliest representatives, Anaximander and Parmenides: "We want to seek out the beginning of Western philosophy," announces Heidegger.

The lecture course falls into three main parts: Part One: The dictum of Anaximander of Miletus, 6th-5th century; Part Two: Interposed considerations; Part Three: The "didactic poem" of Parmenides of Elea, 6th-5th Century. The consideration of Anaximander is relatively short, some 25 pages in all; the "interposed considerations," a series of critical reflections on the question of being and its relation both to us of today and to the Greek beginning, are quite extensive, around 50 pages in the published volume; and the third main part, on Parmenides, is the most developed, some 70 pages in length. An Appendix of almost 50 pages provides notes on both Anaximander and Parmenides and contains many significant insights into the broader context of Heidegger's engagement with these two Presocratic thinkers.

The cessation (or breaking off: Abbruch) of philosophizing? What that means, Heidegger immediately clarifies, is "the end of metaphysics; by way of an originary questioning of the 'meaning' (truth) of Beyng." Nothing more is said directly in the lecture course about either the "end of metaphysics" or the "truth of beyng," but these opening words indicate the more sweeping perspective within which Heidegger's engagement with Anaximander and Parmenides unfolds. Rather than reflect on this more over-arching perspective, however, Heidegger moves to an interpretation of Anaximander's famous saying, which in a typical translation, he suggests, reads: "But whence things take their origin, thence also proceeds their passing away, according to necessity; for they pay one another penalty and retribution for their wickedness according to established time."  Heidegger also cites Nietzsche's translation, from Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks: "Whence things have their origination, thence must they also perish, according to necessity; for they must pay retribution and be judged for their injustices, according to the order of time."

Heidegger's interpretation unfolds in three phases. The theme of the dictum, Heidegger first elaborates in a provisional manner, is ta onta, beings as a whole: not individual beings taken together, in their summation, but beings in that whole which is closest to us, which prevails prior to this or that individual being, and beyond which -- as their whence and whither -- there is nothing. The saying speaks of such beings as a whole with regard to their genesis and phthora, which are to be understood, Heidegger insists, not simply as coming to be and passing away, origination and perishing, but as stepping forth and receding, appearing and disappearing: appearance as the fundamental happening of beings as a whole, as the Being of beings according to the necessity of its happening: as it not only can but essentially must happen. The grounds for this are given in the next part of the dictum; yet here Heidegger argues -- provocatively and persuasively -- that the Greek words dikē, tisis, and adikia are not to be translated in the moral-juridical sense of "justice," "retribution," and "injustice" respectively but rather that these terms have a more fundamental and broader meaning. Heidegger renders them as "compliance" (Fug), "correspondence" (Entspruch), and "non-compliance" (Un-fug), so that the grounds for Being's happening as it must are now given as: "they (beings) bestow compliance and correspondence on one another in consideration of the noncompliance." And this, according to the dictum, happens "according to the measure of time" -- time understood not as a framework within which things happen but rather, as Heidegger clarifies with the aid of a word of Sophocles, as that all-powerful and incalculable time which "lets emerge everything not manifest and conceals everything standing in appearance": time as that which has all things in its power, letting emerge the concealed and concealing (letting disappear) what has once appeared.

Yet if we follow Heidegger's translations of dikē, tisis, and adikia, what is Anaximander's dictum saying? What is really meant by "compliance" and "noncompliance," and by the "correspondence" between beings? The second phase of Heidegger's interpretation proceeds to clarify what turns out to be the "shocking" implication: not simply that beings must of necessity bestow compliance and correspondence on one another, and that this happens according to the measure or "allocation" of time, but that all of this happens "in consideration of noncompliance" -- that "beings in their Being are noncompliant." The "essential power of Being" indeed consists in this noncompliance "according to the power of time." What does that mean? In brief, noncompliance, Heidegger explains, means nothing other than appearing as the "emergent entering into contours" of beings themselves -- from out of, and over against, contourlessness. Beings as such, standing in their apparentness, are noncompliant, out of order -- precisely the opposite of what we would expect! Compliance consists precisely in their abandonment of contours and limits, their return into contourlessness, into limitlessness as that which disposes over the Being of beings. And with this, we have already arrived at the third phase of Heidegger's interpretation, which takes up Anaximander's other pronouncement, namely, that the archē of beings is to apeiron, the limitless. Archē, Heidegger elaborates, is not to be understood as a being, nor as a source that gets left behind, but rather as that "sovereign source" that "remains present precisely in everything, shows itself first and last in all appearance and disappearance": to apeiron, the limitless or contourless, is "the essence of Being" as "the empowering power of appearance and disappearance, i.e., as the ordaining of the noncompliance which recedes into compliance."

Part Two of the lecture course, simply entitled "Interposed considerations," consists of a series of reflections on the entire project of seeking out the "beginning" of Western philosophy, reflections that engage and respond to the many objections that will be raised to this very undertaking. In particular, Heidegger takes up the objection that the past no longer is and that an immense temporal gap exists between us of today and the early Greek thinkers like Anaximander and Parmenides, rendering the pronouncements of these thinkers inaccessible. He addresses the objection by way of an image: that of a wanderer in a desert who increasingly distances himself from a spring or source, from which he once drew water. The wanderer, too far distanced from the spring, eventually dies of thirst. Yet his excessive distance from the spring still remains a relation to the spring, albeit a negative one. Does the wanderer get free of the spring as he proceeds toward his perishing, asks Heidegger? Or is it not rather the case that the spring pursues him all the more insistently the closer he comes to dying of thirst? Is it not indeed the far distant spring that lets him perish? And what if, Heidegger now asks, "in our relation to the beginning of Western philosophy we were such advancing wanderers! What if not just today but since long ago the advancement of Western philosophy were a constant, ever-greater perishing because of its beginning!" What if this beginning were "constantly there in the closest proximity" and indeed remained concealed precisely on account of the so-called advancement? Perhaps, Heidegger suggests, the history that began with this beginning is constantly happening in concealment, while "we" perish from that very beginning. If that is the case, then our task is "to first experience the proximity of the beginning in our Dasein," a task which amounts to nothing less than "involving ourselves in ourselves." How so? The beginning, Heidegger clarifies, is not the dicta and pronouncements of thinkers like Anaximander and Parmenides; rather, their pronouncements are, as such, answers, responses to a question: to a question concerning the Being of beings. "The beginning is thus an act of beginning in a mode of questioning." And where we encounter the question of Being and related matters, "there we are in the proximity of the beginning."

The remaining sections of Part Two unfold the question of Being and related matters through a valuable and insightful set of reflections on the multiple meanings of Being and on the fundamental delimitations in terms of which we tend to understand Being (Being and becoming; Being and the "ought"; Being and thinking; Being and semblance) -- reflections that anticipate and inform the account given several years later in Introduction to Metaphysics (1935). Insofar as the question of Being lies in our closest proximity, albeit no longer asked, so too the beginning is in our closest proximity, but as a beginning that is no longer begun. To ask the question of Being thus means: "to begin again the unbegun beginning," to engage in a re-beginning of the first, inceptual beginning.

Part Three of the lecture course seeks the beginning by way of Parmenides' didactic poem about the goddess Alētheia. The path that leads to alētheia, to truth, or "unconcealment," as Heidegger translates it, as the path set off from the path of opinion (doxa) and from the path that leads to nothingness, demands the cultivation of a certain logos. It demands a legein that gathers and apprehends (noein) Being in its unity: "The apprehension of Being is an understanding of Being that thoroughly discusses in the manner of setting down and so seizes and comprehends Being on the way to conceptualizing Being." The belonging together of Being and apprehension Heidegger calls Parmenides' "axiomatic statement." It articulates Dikē, the "disposing compliance" (verfügende Fug) that "gives the law to Being" and has Being at its disposal. Together with this axiomatic statement, Heidegger identifies what he terms an "essential statement": a statement that articulates an insight into the "essence of Being," namely, as excluding all negativity, as utterly without a "not," entirely un-negative. Third, and decisively, Parmenides indicates that it cannot be said of Being that it "was" or "will be," for in that case it would, once more, contain a "not" and not fully be. This does not mean, however, Heidegger insists, that Being is timeless or eternal but rather that Being stands in a necessary relation to the present and to presence, an insight that he calls Parmenides' "temporal statement." According to the temporal statement, there can be no absence, no void, no "not" in Being as such, and Being simply is the present and presence. And yet -- Heidegger goes on to show, through Parmenides' own statements, that Being, thus understood as presence, is not exclusive of absence but rather encompasses absence and incorporates it within itself. For something can be absent only within the expanse of presence that lets it be at all. "This," exclaims Heidegger, "is what Parmenides is trying to say!" Being is understood as the originary unifying presence, a unifying gathering that occurs prior to all differentiated beings and non-beings, a gathering that is apprehending, noein, conceived as a "waiting against" or "waiting toward" presence (this "waiting against" expressing the literal sense of the German for presence or the present: Gegen‑wart).

A review cannot do justice to the entire richness of this lecture course -- "as if books were written only so that reviewers might not be put out of business," as Heidegger sarcastically remarks! The translation by Richard Rojcewicz, like all of his Heidegger translations, is thoroughly reliable and frequently inspired (the rendition of Fug and Unfug as "compliance" and "noncompliance" respectively is especially felicitous). The most intriguing part of the course is perhaps the closing pages, in which Heidegger relates the problematic of presence and absence to that of Temporality (Temporalität), thereby maintaining a certain continuity of these analyses with the interpretation of ekstatic-horizonal temporality, an interpretation that reached a kind of impasse in the 1927 course The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, precisely concerning the "not" within Being and the entire complicity of absence and presence. More intriguingly still, the closing pages in their reading of Parmenides highlight the issue of corporeality: the apprehension of Being, Heidegger affirms with Parmenides, is no free-floating, pure apprehending, but occurs in corporeality: corporeality understood as not simply the sense-organs, but as "sensuality, as that which bears and rules the entire disposedness of humans." And this sensuality, finally, is to be understood not in terms of the body as corrupt or "evil," but of the body as "the most necessary powerfulness in the sense of deinon -- at once uncanny and much capable." The interpretation of to deinon, the "uncanny," as the Greek experience of the fundamental character of Being in the Presocratic era and the age of tragedy, indeed can be seen to inform the entire backdrop of Heidegger's reading of Anaximander and Parmenides in this lecture course and would result, several years later, in the remarkable reading of the Antigone chorus in Introduction to Metaphysics. The present course is thus in every sense a transition: harking back to the temporal analyses of Being from the period of Being and Time and anticipating the increasing preoccupation with the Presocratics and with Greek tragedy that would mark Heidegger's work from the mid-1930s onward.

[1] Besinnung. Gesamtausgabe vol. 66, 424. Noted by the German editor, Peter Trawny, in his Afterword.