The Critical Theory of Axel Honneth

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Danielle Petherbridge, The Critical Theory of Axel Honneth, Lexington Books, 2013, 256pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739172032.

Reviewed by Lambert Zuidervaart, University of Toronto


Axel Honneth is a leading social philosopher in the tradition of Critical Theory, which originated with Max Horkheimer, Theodor Adorno, and the Institute for Social Research, known collectively as the Frankfurt School. Appointed in 1996 as Jürgen Habermas's successor at the University of Frankfurt and later as the Institute's Director, Honneth has revived the Hegelian Marxist spirit of Critical Theory while putting it into conversation with contemporary French philosophy.

As Danielle Petherbridge shows in her illuminating study, Honneth's mixture of revival and dialogue promises both to revitalize Critical Theory and to entrench problems that have troubled it from the beginning. Two problems in particular receive Petherbridge's attention. One is the challenge of articulating an adequate normative basis for criticizing contemporary society as a whole. An adequate normative basis must not only bear the weight of such large-scale evaluation but also in some sense be immanent to the society under examination. The other perennial issue is to locate agencies within contemporary society that can contribute to its transformation -- "can" implying both able and motivated to bring about genuine emancipatory change. During the heyday of industrial capitalism, Karl Marx pointed to the working class as the agent of social revolution, and he regarded proletarian suffering as the primary indication of what ailed his less-than-good society. Neither the sources of societal ill nor the prospects for significant change were this transparent when Horkheimer and his colleagues launched Critical Theory in the 1930s, however, and the situation has become even more complicated under conditions of cybernetic innovation and economic globalization.

In Part 1, Petherbridge shows how Honneth takes up these issues in response to Habermas's theory of communicative action. Agreeing with Habermas that the normative basis of social critique needs to be intersubjective, Honneth nevertheless regards Habermas's appeal to the universal conditions of language usage as insufficient. Habermas's theory does not link up with pretheoretical motivations for social change, and he seems to restrict the pathologies of power to the norm-free systems of the market and the state. Honneth, by contrast, wishes to locate both the normative basis of social critique and the intersubjective motivation for social change in social struggles for power, which are simultaneously struggles for recognition.

According to Petherbridge, Honneth comes to this position by returning to the anthropological writings of the early Marx, with their emphasis on labor as a process of self-development (Bildung) and on alienation as the concrete experience of how capitalism thwarts self-development. Honneth's critique of capitalism focuses not on its systemic contradictions but on how it wounds human beings. Such wounds are moral injuries, arising from the deeply human need for mutual recognition. Labor is not simply a form of instrumental action (as distinct from communicative action, à la Habermas). It is a mode of social interaction in which people seek and deserve mutual recognition. This suggests, in turn, that class conflicts and other such social conflicts must remain central to a critical social theory. Whereas Habermas reads the history of capitalist modernization as one of both communicative and systemic rationalization, Honneth sees it instead as a dialectical process in which people both achieve and lose mutual recognition: as "the human capacity for freedom as self-realization" via recognition has expanded, it has simultaneously been undermined by "experiences of fragmentation and alienation through labor" (31).

Honneth's challenge, then, is to understand the dynamics of power and of recognition in contemporary society. For the first he turns primarily to Michel Foucault (discussed in Part 2). For the second, he re-reads the Jena writings of G. W. F. Hegel (discussed in Part 3). The primary site for Honneth's reception of Foucault is Kritik der Macht (1985), translated into English as The Critique of Power (1991). Although this work depicts Habermas's theory of communicative action as an advance beyond Adorno and Foucault toward an adequate critical social theory of domination and power, Honneth sees potential in Foucault's work for a better understanding of social struggles. Unfortunately this potential gives way to a theory of institutionalized power -- regimes of discipline -- that undermines any normative critique of existing relations of power. This renders Foucault's approach inarticulate about social suffering, which Honneth later sees as the important "critical-normative impulse" (61) in Adorno's critique of domination. Petherbridge, however, thinks Honneth himself fails to provide "a fully articulated, alternative theory of power" (37). Nor does he really appreciate the implications of Foucault's emphasis on historical contingency for Honneth's own philosophical anthropology.

Taking up these implications, Petherbridge traces Honneth's emphasis on intersubjectivity back to his Social Action and Human Nature, a discussion of philosophical anthropology co-authored with Hans Joas and first published in German in 1980. There Honneth identifies intersubjectivity and the capacity for social action as two "unchanging preconditions of human changeableness" (64). Indeed, particular positive modalities of intersubjectivity and social action anthropologically ground human social evolution, providing natural bases for a normative critique of social interaction. What Honneth overlooks, says Petherbridge, and what closer attention to Foucault's work would have shown, is that certain negative modalities -- "forms of unsocial sociability" -- might also be constants of human intersubjectivity, and that "power might also be an enduring condition of human interaction" (67). Foucault understands that the interplay of power and freedom is unavoidable, even in those domains of communication and recognition where Habermas and Honneth, respectively, wish to find a normative basis for Critical Theory. From Foucault's perspective, it is problematic to ground critical social theory "on the fundamental presupposition of an undamaged notion of intersubjectivity" (78).

Part 3 pursues this problem in Honneth's "intersubjectivist reading" of Hegel, focusing on The Struggle for Recognition (German: 1992, English: 1995). Here Honneth finds an anthropological normative ground for critical social theory in "undamaged intersubjective conditions" that, via relations of recognition, provide the "fundamental preconditions" for both individual self-realization and collective freedom. Petherbridge has two worries about Honneth's move to an anthropological foundation. First, as already articulated, it one-sidedly relies on a "positive" anthropology that ignores "negative" modalities. Second, this move reduces intersubjectivity "to only one of its forms or modalities," namely, recognition (81). Honneth, she claims, equates intersubjectivity with recognition. He can undertake this reduction because his reconstruction of Hegel's System of Ethical Life (1802/3) is quite selective, ignoring intersubjective relations that are not recognitive and downplaying the self-interest, fear, and power that Hegel notes within such relations. As a result, "Honneth fundamentally claims that 'love' rather than struggle is the structural core of recognition" (84). Moreover, the patterns Honneth pieces together into a "three-tiered model of recognition" (99) -- family relations of affection, legal relations of right, and societal relations of solidarity -- equate intersubjectivity with recognition "as a normative first-order category" (104).

Honneth takes this one step further in his reconstruction of two other Jena texts, Hegel's First Philosophy of Spirit (1803/4) and the so-called Realphilosophie (1805/6). On Honneth's reading, recognition is the normative ground for social conflict: social struggle is both motivated by the need for recognition and necessary for achieving "more encompassing recognition relations" (106). The first stage of recognition -- familial love or affection -- is crucial, being necessary both for the development of individual identity and for participation in public life. Again, Petherbridge regards this reconstruction of Hegel as very selective. She also worries that Honneth overburdens familial affection as a "primary form of intersubjectivity" while giving up his own earlier insights into "subject-formation, social conflict and power" (109-10).

From here on Honneth treats recognition as "both a normative and an anthropological concept." According to Petherbridge, this "double determination . . . forms both the uniqueness and . . . the difficulties with Honneth's position" (113). Although it allows Honneth to critique the "pathologies of individual freedom" that accompany individualistic notions and practices of social justice, it also restricts his understanding of how institutions, and the power at work within them, help constitute patterns of recognition (119-21).

Honneth fills in the details to his account of recognition via the social psychology of George Herbert Mead and the psychoanalytic object-relations theory of Donald Winnicott, the topics of Part 4. From Mead, Honneth derives two central insights. First, with his emphasis on the embodied and social character of all human action, Mead points toward a conception of "practical intersubjectivity" that expands intersubjectivity to include prelinguistic gestural communication and corporeal modes of cooperative action. Second, by emphasizing social role-taking in the formation of the self, Mead indicates a social-psychological basis to struggles for recognition, in which self-confidence, self-respect, and self-esteem are fundamental modes of self-relation. Although Petherbridge raises objections to Mead's social psychology, she acknowledges that Honneth's reading of Mead provides a way out of the Habermasian dualism between instrumental and communicative action. It also suggests an account of what motivates individuals to seek social change.

Honneth himself became dissatisfied with Mead's theory, turning instead to Winnicott's object-relations psychoanalysis for an "empirical reconstruction of the primary forms of intersubjectivity and self-formation" (146). Honneth takes Winnicott's notion of "symbiosis" to be definitive for "primary intersubjectivity." All further self-formation depends on the child's successfully finding a balance between initial dependence on its primary caregiver and a growing independence. Petherbridge reviews several objections other theorists have raised to Winnicott's account of symbiosis and Honneth's embrace of this account, including the absence of genuine intersubjectivity, a misconstrual of the mother's supposed dependence on the infant to fulfill her own needs, a tendency to overlook the asymmetrical power at work in parenting, the implausibility of regarding childhood detachment as a struggle for recognition, and Honneth's tendency not to differentiate "between power relations and forms of normative interaction that structure the process of subject-formation" (160).

Honneth responds to some of these objections and modifies his theory accordingly. Yet he regards the need to recreate primary symbiosis as a driving force behind all attempts to negate the independence of others and thereby to deny them recognition. Although it is not clear how this "negative" impulse aligns with moral motivations in the struggle for recognition, Honneth increasingly regards pre-cognitive and pre-moral "affective recognition," rooted in the experiences of early childhood, as "the fundamental ontological basis of the theory of recognition" (164). Hence Petherbridge's reconstruction of Honneth's work traces a gradual conflation from intersubjectivity to recognition and from recognition to primary affective interdependence.

Part 5 both reviews this reconstruction and evaluates Honneth's Critical Theory. First, Petherbridge asks whether Honneth has articulated an adequate normative basis for a comprehensive social critique, a basis that is immanent to society but can claim "context-transcending validity" (167). It appears the jury is still out. On the one hand, Honneth provides a context-transcending, formal concept of ethical life (Sittlichkeit) that rests on the structure of intersubjective social relations, supports the three social spheres of love, law, and achievement, and explains the necessity of recognition for the self-confidence, self-respect, and self-esteem that enter full self-realization. This concept has anthropological and ontological underpinnings, and it permits a critical assessment of existing social patterns without appearing to privilege a particular conception of the good.

On the other hand, as Honneth acknowledges in more recent work such as Redistribution or Recognition? (2003, with Nancy Fraser), that the three spheres of recognition and the forms of practical relation that accompany them have arisen in the historical development of "bourgeois-capitalist society." So we must distinguish more carefully between the societally variable content of recognition and the anthropologically invariant form of our moral expectations for recognition. In this connection Honneth spells out three normative principles, internal to patterns of recognition, to which people can appeal when they encounter misrecognition: the neediness, equality, and achievement principles (170-1). He also introduces a notion of moral progress against which one can judge the desirability of social changes, namely, whether they contribute to greater individualization and social inclusion. Still, such criteria seem to presuppose a specifically modern and Western ideal of self-realization and, as Christopher Zurn has argued, one cannot simply assume the context-transcending validity of this ideal (174).

In the end, according to Petherbridge, Honneth must ground his theory of recognition in an anthropological and ontological account. For that he turns, in Reification (2008), to "affectivity" as a primary attunement to others, self, and world that precedes and makes possible the relations of love, law, and achievement -- a move that brings Honneth closer, in different ways, to both Heidegger and Adorno. Whether affectivity itself should be understood as a matter of intersubjective recognition is unclear. What is clear from this latest ontological move, at least to Petherbridge, is that conflict, struggle, and power no longer play a significant role in Honneth's critical social theory of recognition.

Accordingly, the last chapter asks whether Honneth provides an adequate critique of power. He does not, says Petherbridge, both because his conception of power is insufficiently complex and because he has sought an anthropological ground for normative critique. The lack of complexity stems from Honneth's tendency, following Habermas and the Frankfurt School, to reduce power to domination. It also stems from a failure to see that power is intrinsic to all social relations and institutions, including recognitive ones and including any critique of power. As an alternative, Petherbridge points to a "relational" concept of power, derived from Foucault and others, that regards power as "enabling and productive, not coercive nor prohibitory" (190). A relational concept would help one avoid Honneth's problematic separation between power and recognition and a concomitant Habermasian separation "between norm-free and power-free forms of action" (199). Because Petherbridge regards Honneth's anthropological turn as the primary reason why he separates recognition from power, she refuses an anthropological ground for a normative critique of power. Instead, she concludes, "we must find ways to ground critique that can account for the enduring human capacity for both normative and power-based forms of intersubjectivity" (200).

Danielle Petherbridge's book is an expansive and insightful reconstruction of Axel Honneth's critical social theory. It is alert to the dialectical shifts in his conception as he responds to new conversation partners, and it highlights fundamental issues that explain the trajectory of his work. Petherbridge has made a valuable contribution to the literature on contemporary Critical Theory.

Yet I find her book oddly dissatisfying at the end, for she seems to shift the meaning of "critique" from what Honneth calls "a diagnosis of social pathologies" to a mere description of human capacities and existing institutions. Correlatively, she seems to give up Honneth's concern about "context-transcending validity." Even if one does not reduce power to domination, surely the point of a Critical Theory is to expose patterns of power that are problematic -- oppression, exploitation, domination, and the like -- and to help people envision and achieve their transformation. Even if one acknowledges the power at work in all patterns of recognition, one still needs to say which patterns are better and which are worse for human flourishing or some other good. For that, a relational concept of power is not enough. We also need a normative concept. Perhaps the greatest contribution of Petherbridge's book is to demonstrate this need.