The Enneads of Plotinus: A Commentary, Volume 1

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Paul Kalligas, The Enneads of Plotinus: A CommentaryVolume 1, Elizabeth Key Fowden and Nicolas Pilavachi (trs.), Princeton University Press, 2014, 706pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691154213.

Reviewed by Dominic O'Meara, University of Fribourg


In 1994, Paul Kalligas began the publication of his edition of Plotinus' Enneads in Athens, under the auspices of the Academy of Athens. The first volume, containing Ennead I, was followed by volumes containing Ennead II (1997), Ennead III (2004), and Ennead IV (2009). Enneads V and VI are forthcoming. This work is the most important contribution to a critical edition of Plotinus' Greek text since the foundational editions published by Paul Henry and Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (editio maior 1951-1973; editio minor 1964-1982). In his edition, Kalligas takes account of the various corrections and improvements of the Greek text suggested, after the publication of the editio minor, both by Henry and Schwyzer and by other scholars, and makes carefully considered improvements to the Greek text. He also provides, with his critical edition, a Modern Greek translation of Plotinus' text, brief synopses of each Plotinian treatise, and detailed notes (philological, historical and philosophical) on difficult passages in the treatises. The present publication collects, in one volume, in English translation, the synopses and notes for Enneads I-III, and we can look forward to two future volumes, covering Enneads IV-V and Ennead VI. This first volume contains neither the Greek text of Plotinus, nor a translation. Kalligas takes here, as his point of reference, the English translation by A. H. Armstrong (Plotinus, 1966-1988) and provides a list of his suggested improvements of the Greek text for Enneads I-III (657-668). Thus the reader of this book can use it conveniently, perhaps in conjunction with study of Plotinus' works in the Greek of the Henry-Schwyzer edition (but Kalligas does not presuppose knowledge of Greek), while reading Armstrong's English translation. We have, therefore, in the present publication, an invaluable companion to be used when reading the Plotinian treatises included in Enneads I-III.

In his Preface, Kalligas points to some of the reasons why Plotinus is a philosopher worth reading. While standing in the tradition of Greek philosophy, working in a framework set by Plato, Aristotle and Hellenistic philosophy (in particular, Stoicism), Plotinus also lives in a world of transition, of new and profound social, political, spiritual and cultural changes that would lead to the Byzantine, Latin and Islamic Middle Ages and the Italian Renaissance. Plotinus played a major role in the transmission of Greek philosophy to these later periods and in its transformation in relation to new contexts. Plotinus is also a philosopher who sometimes strikes us, Kalligas suggests, as anticipating modern ideas. He is, I would add, an exciting author to read: one has the impression that one is following someone who is really thinking -- and not just summarizing things for students -- and is capable of finding new and profound ways of seeing things. In the English-speaking world, Plotinus has suffered from his being enlisted posthumously in the cause of the late antique pagan theology of Proclus, in the cause of a new Christian theology by Marsilio Ficino in the Renaissance and in the cause of Hegelianism. More recent work, of the highest quality, on Plotinus has made it easier to come back to Plotinus himself and to his philosophy (to the work done by Henry, Schwyzer and Armstrong, we can add now the present volume by Kalligas), and it may be that the residual prejudice against him that can still be felt in particular in some Oxbridge/Ivy league philosophy departments (the late Michael Frede was an exception) may weaken.

In his Preface, Kalligas also points to some of the reasons that make it difficult to read Plotinus and create the need to which his comments are intended to respond. Although Plotinus' primary terms of reference are known to us (the works of Plato and of Aristotle), he also presupposes intermediary sources, commentators on Plato and Aristotle and other sources of the Hellenistic and early Roman imperial period, whom Plotinus does not name and whose works are in large part no longer available to us. To understand better the world of discourse in which Plotinus operates we need to identify and reconstruct as far as possible these intermediary sources. This is one of the tasks Kalligas undertakes in his comments on difficult or obscure passages in the Enneads. Another source of difficulty mentioned by Kalligas is the polemical character and context of some passages in Plotinus; here also, the necessary background to understanding Plotinus' argument escapes us and here again Kalligas tries, in his comments, to provide help. His comments show a very wide and detailed knowledge, not only of philosophical literature of the Hellenistic and Roman Imperial periods, but also of historical sources. Plotinus' opponents included Gnostic sects that propagated what he considered to be a perverse use of Plato. Kalligas takes advantage of the discoveries made in the last century of new Gnostic texts (in particular the Nag Hammadi library) in order to situate more precisely Plotinus' polemics. Finally, Kalligas suggests that Plotinus' philosophy is very systematic: its parts are closely linked with each other, but are not necessarily all in evidence in particular passages. Interpreting these passages therefore requires reference to the broader theoretical structure that is presupposed, a task which Kalligas' comments also undertake. Such is the systematic unity of Plotinus' philosophy that there is no one "doorway" to it, Kalligas suggests (xi). Or, perhaps, every point in it is a doorway! Kalligas also provides on occasion a fine-grained analysis of the structure of Plotinus' arguments, when this structure is difficult to grasp.[1]

When Plotinus' pupil Porphyry published his edition of Plotinus' works, the Enneads, in c. 300 AD (Plotinus had died in 270), he prefaced the edition with a Life of Plotinus, which provides a listing of Plotinus' treatises (roughly) in the chronological order of their composition, while ordering the treatises, in his edition, in an enneadic order ("nines", i.e., six sets of nine treatises each), according to numerological and thematic criteria. Although modern scholars have advocated getting away from the artificiality of Porphyry's arrangement and a return to the chronological order, Kalligas stays with the enneadic ordering (I feel that he is too kind to Porphyry here). Kalligas also does not believe that reading the treatises in chronological order reveals any major development in Plotinus' thought. His volume then begins, as does Porphyry's edition, with Porphyry's Life of Plotinus. Detailed and informative comments on the Life of Plotinus are preceded by an introduction, a detailed chronological chart and a map of the Roman Empire. Kalligas then moves to Plotinus' Enneads, providing a brief synopsis of each treatise and comments on passages of the kind I have mentioned above. The treatises included by Porphyry, on thematic grounds (subjects having to do with ethics and natural philosophy), in Enneads I-III discuss, among other things: the human 'self', the virtues, happiness, beauty, evil, suicide, the stars, matter, the Gnostic view of the constitution of the world, fate, providence, love, eternity and time, and how nature produces. The volume ends with specific bibliographies for each particular treatise.

A general bibliography, to which Kalligas also refers, is due to appear in volume 3, but in the meantime can be consulted on a Princeton University Press website. Also included are some images of what have been identified as portraits of Plotinus. Finally, there is an index of the ancient sources cited in Kalligas' comments on Enneads I-III. The English translation of Kalligas' Modern Greek is clear and elegant. Such is the high quality of Kalligas' work, the breath of his historical and philological learning, his deep knowledge of Plotinus' work and sensitive analysis of the text, that this volume can be recommended strongly as a valuable guide to those who wish to read any of the treatises of Enneads I-III.

[1] Kalligas' approach, providing comments on particular passages in Plotinus, is also used in the series of individual Plotinian treatises currently being published in English translation (The Enneads of Plotinus with Philosophical Commentaries, Parmenides Publishing, Las Vegas, edited by John M. Dillon and Andrew Smith). A different approach, in which emphasis is placed on clarifying, not so much particular passages as the movement of thought and the continuous development of Plotinus' argument throughout each treatise, is followed in the series founded by Pierre Hadot, which publishes individual treatises in French translation ("Les Écrits de Plotin", Les Éditions du Cerf, Paris). The movement of thought in each treatise, another important feature of Plotinus' writing that is sometimes difficult to grasp, is somewhat lost in an approach concentrating on selected passages.