The Ethics of Democracy: A Contemporary Reading of Hegel's Philosophy of Right

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Lucio Cortella, The Ethics of Democracy: A Contemporary Reading of Hegel's Philosophy of Right, Giacomo Donis (tr.), SUNY Press, 2015, 215pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438457536.

Reviewed by Lydia L. Moland, Colby College


That democracy is the best form of government has, since Hegel's time, become an almost unquestioned assumption in political philosophy. Hegel's opposition to direct democracy seems then to put him squarely on the wrong side of history, forcing sympathetic interpreters either to defend or discount this unfortunate choice. Lucio Cortella's book is a welcome addition to this debate.[1] Cortella argues that there is still much in Hegel's theory to recommend it: he belongs, then, to the group of scholars who attempt to reform Hegel's philosophy in the hopes that it can be better applied. In pursuit of this goal, Cortella is not content to suggest minor amendments to Hegel's system; his goal is nothing less than to free "Hegel's theory of recognition from its 'idealist' self-comprehension" (148) by engaging in a "democratization of his conception of ethical life" (xxv). In my view, Hegel's idealism is not as pernicious for his political philosophy as Cortella claims, but Cortella's description of the potential of Hegel's philosophy in the contemporary world is nevertheless persuasive and inspiring.

The book's preface begins by admitting the tension obvious in its title. On the one hand, "Hegel, notoriously, does not belong to the tradition of democratic thought"; on the other, "the theory of the liberal state . . . resolutely denies the need for ethics as the basis of social life and the pillar of state institutions" (xxi). So why is an ethics of democracy needed? And if we grant this need, why turn to Hegel? Cortella's answer is that an ethical state in Hegel's view does not mean one grounded in a particular ethical viewpoint but rather that "political institutions have an implicit ethical purpose -- that is, they play an educative and formative role for the citizens" (xxiii). The goal, then, is to draw out this strain of Hegel's philosophy in the interest of forming contemporary global citizens.

The introduction lays out key claims in Hegel's political philosophy, deftly explicating difficult Hegelian concepts such as the will, abstract right, and morality. Chapter 1 defines freedom as the foundational concept in Hegel's ontology, then enumerates the characteristics of this freedom. Freedom must, for instance, be "self-transparent": we must know we are free in order to be free. It must also include relation, by which Hegel means that I gain my freedom by recognizing others' freedom. This recognition requires me to curb my self-interest in acknowledgment of another's self-interest; by subjecting my desires to this compromise, I come to control them and be free in them. In Chapter 2, Cortella describes the emergence of personhood in what he calls the "age of universal freedom," recounts Hegel's objections to Kantian morality, and introduces the institutions of Hegelian ethical life. All of this is related with admirable clarity; readers looking for a succinct but informative account of Hegelian Sittlichkeit will be very well served by Cortella's analysis. Cortella is especially good at tracing how the modern rift between subject and substance prompts the development of civil society and how civil society's originally arbitrary needs prompt intersubjective recognition among citizens, thus contributing to their freedom. Hegel's hope that modern ethical life will, through its multiple layers of recognition and its mutually reinforcing institutions, unite individuals with the universal and so achieve the synthesis at the heart of idealism is also compellingly described. But Cortella ends this chapter on a skeptical note, warning that "it remains to be seen whether Hegel's promise of an interweaving of individual freedom, relational freedom, and universality will be kept" (81).

Indeed, Cortella argues in Chapter 3 that it is not. To blame is a lack of real recognition between the state and its citizens. When two people recognize each other, each acknowledges the other as a "lord," mutually curbing their desires and so augmenting their own freedom. The state by contrast does not acknowledge its citizens as lords: instead it "asserts itself as the individual's supreme truth" (111). The universal, to put it another way, "does not reciprocate," preventing recognition at this level from being intersubjective in the same way that characterizes relations among people (111). The lack of reciprocity precipitates what Cortella calls the "subjectivity deficit" in the Philosophy of Right (120): since recognition between state and citizen cannot be completely reciprocal, the citizen's subjectivity cannot be fully acknowledged. Cortella grants that this result is not Hegel's intent: Hegel "continues to insist that the prevalence of the universal element by no means entails a loss of individual freedom" (116). But if Hegel, despite his intentions, fails to include subjectivity in his political philosophy and so fails to preserve citizens' freedom, the central aspiration of his philosophy fails as well.

In my opinion, however, Cortella's analysis of Hegel's ideal state in relation to its citizens is misleading on a few counts. For instance, he cites Hegel's refusal "to attribute sovereignty to a people without a sovereign" as evidence that he attributes sovereignty "to the sovereign alone" (122). But the second claim surely does not follow from the first. Hegel's ideal monarch is bound to the constitution, often required only to "sign his name" to put the legislature's laws into effect.[2] As to why a monarch is then even necessary, Hegel suggests that without an official who is independent of election cycles, the state will become vulnerable to moneyed interests, demagogues, and impulsive short-term goals -- all, unfortunately, prescient concerns on his part. If such forces prevail, citizens will not learn how to take the interests of the group into consideration, preventing them from recognizing their fellow citizens and in turn stunting their own freedom. So Hegel's claim that a people without a sovereign is just a "formless mass" is not meant to exclude citizens from sovereignty but to acknowledge the dangers of direct democracy.[3] Hegel in fact reserves an important place for individuals' participation in the government through corporations: an attempt, in my opinion, to ensure that economic welfare rather than arbitrary geographic location is at the heart of the state's balance of powers.

I also think that Cortella insufficiently considers ways that recognition of individuals is built into Hegel's description of the state. Hegel uses the term Volk als Staat (not Nationalstaat, a term unknown in Hegel's time) to describe his ideal political formation. The "Volk" component of this designation is meant to acknowledge the language, customs, history, and practices that underpin individuals' political identities. A "Volk als Staat" is a group of people who share traditions that form them as individuals but who have also submitted those practices to evaluation, endorsing only those that allow them to foster freedom in their community. Insofar as individual subjects are constituted by their particular national culture, then, that subjectivity is recognized by the state in Hegel's scheme.

These considerations may not mitigate Cortella's concern that the state is unable to recognize citizens in the same way they recognize each other. But surely the way recognition is expressed varies depending on context. What particular behavior counts as recognition of family members differs from what is expected of my attitudes towards my fellow citizens: what is expected in one case will often be inappropriate in the other. And since the state is in fact not a person, its manner of recognizing citizens will necessarily be more abstract. If the state does nevertheless recognize its citizens through the representation of the corporations and through integrating citizens' national identities, the subjectivity deficit may not be as severe as Cortella suggests.

Cortella also argues that world history presents a major obstacle to Hegel's philosophical goals. Freedom, as we have seen, requires self-transparency, and Cortella argues that by Hegel's own description, "history is intransparent" (131). This is because there can be no world state, leaving individual nation states in a Hobbesian war of all against all, unable to recognize each other and unify in the way citizens within a nation can unify. As a solution, Hegel proposes that we look to world history or, even less helpfully, to the insufficiently defined "world's court of judgment". But these higher viewpoints in Cortella's opinion cannot solve the problem since "the 'logic of the world' remains wholly inscrutable for historical subjects, who cannot recognize themselves in it as an expression of their own conscious activity" (130). There are, I think, two separate claims here. One is that the great forces of history outstrip human comprehension; given that Hegel's idealism requires that the world be transparent in order for us to be free, history prevents us from achieving this freedom. The other is that we cannot see our own agency reflected in the seemingly necessary progress of history. In the face of this inscrutability and lack of agency, Hegel has two unattractive choices. He can claim that ethical life is a "'Fortunate Isle' in the middle of the ocean of history," uniquely exempted from necessary but inscrutable forces around it (130). Alternately, he could admit that "the reconciliation of subject and object within the ethical becomes an incomplete reconciliation" (131). For a systematic thinker like Hegel, however, both options would threaten the cohesiveness of the whole.

But is world history on Hegel's view really inscrutable? When Hegel describes history as "a simply truthful combination of the miseries that have overwhelmed the noblest of nations and polities," a narrative combining "a hopeless sadness, counterbalanced by no consolatory result," this is not his final word on the matter.[4] If it were, it would indeed mean that humans could not recognize their place in the world and so not be free. But Hegel is equally convinced that "the history of the world is nothing but the development of the consciousness of the idea of freedom" and that if we "look at the world rationally," we will recognize this progress.[5] The job of the historian, then, is not simply to recount events, but to find in them the trajectory towards freedom that will make humans feel at home in our world. We might of course disagree with the idea that humans' consciousness of freedom is progressing or balk at the suggestion that we should reinterpret history's darkest chapters as stages in that progress. But remembering Hegel's commitment to what world history means suggests that he does not see history as inscrutable and thinks we need not either.

But if history is simply the necessary development of freedom, does that not exacerbate the sense that humans are not acting freely but are instead pawns in an evolution beyond their control? Here I think it is important not to over-interpret the necessity Hegel claims to find in history. Hegel was under no illusion that freedom was developing in a constant or straight trajectory. George O'Brien has used the American Civil War to illustrate this point: although from a Hegelian point of view Americans' slowly developing consciousness of the evils of slavery made the emancipation of slaves inevitable, how that emancipation happened -- with what kind of bloodshed, etc., -- was still up to individuals alive at that time.[6] So while an ideal Hegelian historian looks always for evidence that freedom is advancing, she also realizes that she can affect the speed and manner of that process. That should allow her to feel at home in her society insofar as she can see freedom's development in broad strokes and recognize her own agency in shaping its particulars. Her ethical life need not be a "Fortunate Isle" exempted from the forces of necessity; she must instead understand which parts of history are necessary and which are not and then act accordingly.

Even if Hegel's idealism is not as damaging to his overall project as Cortella suggests, the "postidealist ethical life" he describes in Chapter 4, and especially the "democratization of Hegel's political philosophy," offer compelling suggestions regarding what contemporary ethical life might look like (137). Cortella turns to Hegel's Jena writings in which recognition is only between two humans with no "spirit" or "idea" standing behind them as the "real" unity. Freed of this third term, the two subjects can truly attribute a "status, a value, a dignity to the other" and freedom becomes "a historical acquisition by empirical individuals who conquer it progressively through processes of socialization" (151). Instead of being justified as part of the self-determining Idea, the "validity of the ethical spheres is grounded in their constitution by the logic of recognition as an inescapable normative background" (153).

Once recognition is purged of idealism, Cortella is optimistic that it can provide a model for contemporary international politics. It can help us distinguish between necessary spheres of ethical life and understand what kind of recognition is required in each (155). It can show how true recognition must guide our attitudes to those beyond our own nation state. And it can become the basis of a "democratic ethical life" in which the state protects non-political social spheres and educates its citizens in a kind of constitutional patriotism. Democracy will then be free to defend a diversity of goods, making modern ethical life a "veritable school of pluralism." And while this pluralism need not result in a world state, it can aid in the "constitution, on a global scale, of international institutions and of a common praxis modeled on the tradition of freedom and of rights" (165). I think Hegel would indeed have very little objection to this kind of democracy: it was the atomistic, unfettered variety in which citizens are only encouraged to think in terms of their own self-interest that he actively discouraged.

I agree with Cortella that Hegel's philosophy has the potential to help us think deeply about the modern world. And surely an ethical sensibility that helps us determine how to recognize each other at the global level would have appealed to Hegel. If such a view can be attributed to him, he may end up on the right side of history after all. Should that happen, he will have eloquent interpreters like Cortella to thank for it.


Hegel, G.W.F. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Translated by H. B. Nisbet. Edited by Allen W. Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.

-- -- -- . Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction: Reason in History. Translated by H. B. Nisbet. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975.

-- -- -- . The Philosophy of History. Translated by J. Sibree. Amherst, N.Y.: Prometheus Books, 1991.

O'Brien, George Dennis. Hegel on Reason and History: A Contemporary Interpretation. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1975.

[1] This book was originally published in Italian in 2011. The translation by Giacomo Donis is admirably lucid and fluent.

[2] Elements of the Philosophy of Right, §297 Z.

[3] Ibid §279A.

[4] Lectures on the Philosophy of World History 99, 150.

[5] The Philosophy of History, 31.

[6] Hegel on Reason and History,146.