The Furniture of the World: Essays in Ontology and Metaphysics

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Guillermo Hurtado and Oscar Nudler (eds.), The Furniture of the World: Essays in Ontology and Metaphysics, Rodopi, 2012, 336pp., $94.50 (pbk), ISBN 9789042035034.

Reviewed by Susana Nuccetelli, St. Cloud State University


This collection of seventeen new essays, most of them written originally in English, are nearly all on topics of interest to contemporary metaphysics, but their quality and preferred approach differ greatly. Some are historical, such as those by Pierre Aubenque and José Robles; others engage in current matters of philosophical controversy within core areas of analytic philosophy, such as those by Diana I. Pérez, Gonzalo Rodríguez Pereyra and Oscar Nudler, which I'll examine in some detail below.

There are five sections: "Ontology: General Outlooks," "The Structure of the World," "Language and Reality," "Bodies, Minds and Persons," and "Ontology of Culture, Politics, Literature and Art." Topics include the possibility of a rigorous metaphysics (Aubenque), the foundations of ontology (Guillermo Hurtado), the relation between metaphysics and informatics (Barry Smith), Héctor Neri Castañeda's guise theory (Alejandro Herrera Ibáñez), reductionism about space and time (Juan Rodríguez Larreta), metaphysical issues concerning Newtonian space and time (Robles, Laura Benítez), the view that some true propositions are made true by truthmakers (Rodríguez Pereyra), the metaphysical implications of Pyrrhonism (Plinio Junqueira Smith), the plausibility of metaphysical realism (Carlos Pereda, Samuel M. Cabanchik), the current revival of dualism in philosophy of mind (Pérez), personal identity (Francisco Naishtat), the problems facing liberal individualism (Nudler), the nature of cultural entities (Lorenzo Peña), ontology in works of art (Alejandro Tomasini), and J. L. Borges on the intentions of a literary author (James Hamilton).

Questions arise as to why the editors have included some essays that bear almost exclusively on other areas of philosophy such as political philosophy and philosophy of culture and art. In addition, more needs to be said about the editors' distinction between ontology and metaphysics. But before having a closer look at that distinction, let's consider two minor worries about the design of the collection.

One concerns its rationale and unity. Although the volume promises to be "a showcase of recent Latin American ontology and metaphysics" (Introduction, p. 8), the book doesn't live up to this promise. For one thing, except for Hamilton's essay on Borges, the rest of the essays are on topics and approaches that bear no distinctive relationship to Latin America -- which suggests that it might instead be "ontology and metaphysics in Latin America" that the editors had in mind. Yet that description is clearly not accurate either, since some of the contributors are not Latin Americans themselves, nor do they work in Latin America (e.g., Aubenque, Smith, Peña, and Hamilton). They might well be "distinguished teachers who have had important contacts with the Latin-American philosophical community" (p. 8), but more than this is needed if the volume is to deliver on its promise. The other worry concerns the omission of a list of contributors, something especially important since many of them are likely to be unknown to the intended readership.

Let's now turn to the ontology/metaphysics distinction. One would expect that the type of problem characteristic of each of these two disciplines would be identified in the book's Introduction. After all, both are invoked in its subtitle and one or the other in each of the essays. Yet the editors play down the distinction, briefly characterizing only metaphysics as the one that's concerned "with being or entity in the most general sense" (p. 8). I think, however, that there is a perspicuous distinction to be drawn: one that runs along Quinean lines, as recently suggested by Ned Block (forthcoming). On this view, metaphysics is concerned with the ultimate nature of things, ontology with the types of things a theory is committed to countenancing. For example, a metaphysical account of pain is one concerned with determining the nature of pain, which in turn requires identifying what all pains have in common in virtue of which they are pains. On the other hand, an ontological account of pain is concerned with determining the ontological commitments acquired by countenancing pains in one's theory. That is, on this view whether one's theory of pain entails the existence of anything immaterial is not a metaphysical question but rather an ontological one.

Note that these two questions are independent, since a functionalist about pain may reject any ontological commitment to immaterial things, thus aligning herself with physicalism rather than dualism on the ontological question. But she is committed to disagreeing with both metaphysical physicalism and dualism about the nature of pain. After all, to account for what all pains have in common qua pains, the functionalist would invoke a certain functional role they all have in common, while the physicalist would invoke something physical and the dualist something immaterial. That is, functionalism competes with both physicalism and dualism on the metaphysical account of pain, but it's consistent with either physicalism or dualism on the ontological account. Although the functionalist may not countenance immaterial things in her ontology, her metaphysical thesis does not commit her to rejecting them. She could, but need not, be an ontological dualist.

Perhaps that's why Pérez, in her "Dualism and Physicalism in Contemporary Philosophy of the Mind" (Part IV, pp. 223-30) identifies functionalism with a kind of dualism -- for example, Jaegwon Kim's (1998, 2005) functionalism. But first, Kim's (2005) position differs considerably from his (1998). In addition, some qualifications are in order given the above distinction between metaphysics and ontology. For with regard to the metaphysical question about mental properties (and states and events, that could be paraphrased in the language of properties), Kim defends (in both works) a version of metaphysical functionalism as an alternative to both metaphysical dualism and metaphysical physicalism. With regard to the ontological question, Kim's (2005) combines dualism about phenomenal properties with physicalism about any other mental properties. Therefore it would be inaccurate to identify functionalism with dualism across the board, ignoring its complex relationships with dualism and physicalism as argued above. In fact, Kim's position illustrates nicely the need for a fine-grained ontology/metaphysics distinction.

Let's now consider Pérez's own conception of physicalism, which she proposes as an antidote to certain confusions she finds at the root of current arguments against physicalism (p. 234). The confusions appear to be those of defining physicalism as the epistemic thesis that mental properties could be completely explained by (reduced to, etc.) something physical and the ontological thesis that everything that exists is physical. Pérez contends that since physicalism has so far failed to meet the desiderata set out by the epistemic thesis, this has fueled pro-dualist arguments in philosophy of mind (e.g., by Saul Kripke, Frank Jackson, and David Chalmers). In reply to those arguments, physicalists should emphasize that their thesis "does not suppose, qua ontological thesis, that the same concepts that we ordinarily use to refer to the phenomena that are taken to be non-physical are enough to explain these non-physical phenomena on the basis of the physical" (p. 236). They should also have confidence that "new concepts for understanding the mind" could be developed by science in the future, and help to solve the puzzle of how to explain (reduce, etc.) the mental in physical terms (pp. 236-37).

Although it is not possible to address here the details of this defense of physicalism, I think that understanding the positions at stake in this debate requires further qualifications. First, a definition of physicalism narrower than the thesis that everything that exists is physical or ultimately depends on the physical (p. 224) would be more helpful. After all, a number of quite different theses can be read off Pérez's general definition. If we consider the above metaphysics/ontology distinction, what's at stake in the mind/body problem debate can be cast as a metaphysical question concerning the nature of mental properties and their relationship, if any, to physical properties. The physicalist answer to that question is that all mental properties are, or ultimately depend on (in a sense to be spelled out), physical properties. Thus construed, physicalism has other rivals besides dualism. They include not only metaphysical functionalism (see above) but also metaphysical eliminativism (for which there are no mental properties at all). So if confusions about how to construe metaphysical physicalism -- together with the failure of epistemic physicalism -- in fact support anti-physicalist arguments, then there are more positions than dualism that would benefit from those arguments. Pérez owes us a reason for holding that it is only dualism that has profited from those confusions.

Another fine essay in the collection, Rodríguez-Pereyra's "Why Truthmakers" (Part III, pp. 129-47), argues for the following principle (p. 130):

TM   Necessarily, if <p> is true, then there is some entity in virtue of which it is true

where p is a synthetic propositions containing an inessential predicate. For example,

(1)  The rose is red

Given TM, (1) is made true by an entity, a truthmaker (p. 136). But consider the proposition

(2)  (1) is made true by an entity

It follows from TM that (2) is made true by another entity, which appears to lead to a vicious regress and an inflationary ontology -- unless of course, it could be argued that (2) is analytic. (Recall that TM applies only to a certain kind of "synthetic" propositions.)

In any case, TM seems very challenging: stronger than any supervenience principles it entails (p. 135), it requires that truth be grounded "in whether things are" (p. 135). Yet how challenging TM in fact is depends on the ontological status of the alleged truthmakers. Rodríguez-Pereyra provides no consistent answer to this question, asserting in the conclusion that "What that truth maker is, I don't claim to know" (p. 145), and in a note that "Succinctly, my view is that truthmakers of propositions like that a is F are facts (or states of affairs) whose all and only constituents are resembling particulars" (n. 1, p. 129). Since this suggests that truthmakers are not fictional facts, TM appears challenging after all.

For clearly such facts would be made out of properties that are unlikely to figure in a final scientific inventory of what there is. If so, truthmakers are not the sort of facts that most philosophers, from Quine to Horwich, would like to countenance (cf. pp. 139, 142-143) -- at any rate, not after the naturalistic turn in early 20th century analytic philosophy, with its rejection of claims about the existence of facts that were not, at least in principle, defeasible by empirical evidence. In other words, given philosophical naturalism, no theory of truthmakers can be adequate unless it comes with a plausible account of how such facts would fit in the natural order and be amenable to legitimate methods of inquiry. Without these, truthmakers remain ontological and epistemic "spooks."

A further problem facing TM concerns the main argument for it (pp. 138-39), namely:

(1)  Truth is grounded

(2)  Grounding is a relation

(3)  Relations link entities


(4)  Truth is grounded in entities

where 'grounding' refers to the truth of synthetic propositions' being contingent upon reality (n. 7, p. 133). Something has gone wrong with this argument, for it seems to lead to an ontological explosion. For example, mutatis mutandis it could be run to argue that falsity is grounded in entities. After all, the falsity of synthetic propositions is also contingent upon reality, so falsity seems grounded too. Therefore, certain false propositions would be made false by falsitymakers, which should be added to Rodríguez-Pereyra's already inflated ontology.

Nudler's "Modern Political Ontology: Evolution and Revolution" (Part V, pp. 265-80) is thinly related to the theme of the collection by bearing on the 'political ontologies' presupposed by modern liberalism and current communitarianism. By 'political ontologies' Nudler seems to mean the conceptions of political entities held by these opposite positions. The essay looks closely at liberalism as formulated by salient modern and contemporary figures (Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau, Mill, and Rawls), arguing that modern liberalism won the upper-hand against both the communitarianism of the Middle Ages and the individualism of Ancient Greece. All liberal models hold that human beings can make free choices, independent of any social order. All agree in "the ontological primacy of the individual" (p. 273) and in the Millean principles of liberty and neutrality of civil society with respect to diverse religious beliefs.

But for Nudler, liberalism cannot solve conflicts of intolerance and discrimination against minorities arising in contemporary Western societies. On the whole, he is sympathetic to common communitarian reasons against liberal individualism (e.g., those of Michael Sandel and Charles Taylor). His support of communitarianism is, however, qualified -- perhaps because liberals could accommodate some communitarian values and endorse, say, taxation to support public health, police, and fire departments. That is, liberals could accommodate some communitarian values provided it would be in individuals' self-interest to do so.

Yet Nudler's main critique of liberalism is its inability to solve the problem of intolerance in pluralistic societies, as shown in Western European liberal states. For this critique to get off the ground, however, something needs to be said about Rawls's attempts to solve that problem with notions such as public reason and reflective equilibrium (Rawls 1996, Scanlon 2002, Lehning 2009). Other issues Nudler alludes to by in his critique of liberalism concern environmental problems and the possibility of a mixed theory combining communitarian and cosmopolitan values to yield an adequate "theoretical understanding of the complex economic, political, cultural dynamics of the world system" (p. 279). But since neither of these is fully spelled out in the text, Nudler's contribution remains primarily a historically-minded analysis of modern liberalism and current communitarianism.


Block, N. "Functional Reduction." Supervenience in Mind, T. Horgan, D. Sosa, and M. Sabates (eds.). MIT Press (forthcoming). Accessed 8/21/2012. 

Kim, J. Mind in the Physical World. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, Bradford Book, 1998.

Kim, J. Physicalism, or Something Near Enough. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 2005.

Lehning, P. B. John Rawls: An Introduction. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2009.

Rawls, J. Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press, 1996.

Scanlon, T. M. "Rawls on Justification." The Cambridge Companion to Rawls, S. Freeman (ed.), pp. 139-67.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.