The Great Riddle: Wittgenstein and Nonsense, Theology and Philosophy

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Stephen Mulhall, The Great Riddle: Wittgenstein and Nonsense, Theology and Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2015, 138pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755326.

Reviewed by Mark Addis, Birmingham City University


Over the years there has been a steadily growing literature on Wittgenstein-inspired grammatical approaches to the understanding of religious language. Stephen Mulhall's recent book derived from his 2014 Stanton Lectures is a well written, carefully argued and sophisticated contribution which centrally rests upon a resolute reading of the early Wittgenstein. His project is to take the resolute reading combined with several other additional ways of reading Wittgenstein, such as Malcolm on analogy, to bring out hitherto unnoticed aspects of his work and offer a properly philosophically grounded articulation of grammatical Thomism. As the chapters progress there are steadily increasing layers of sophisticated Wittgenstein interpretation, such as that involving analogy, which build upon each other to claim that his later work has a perfectionist dimension which relates to the concerns of moral perfectionism and 'perfection' and 'transcendentals'.

Mulhall claims that Analytical Thomists do have substantial grounds for asserting that Wittgenstein's conception of nonsense as a philosophical category is relevant to the philosophical interpretation of Aquinas, provided that the category has been subjected to appropriate philosophical examination. The idea that Wittgenstein's later philosophy contains ineffable forms of nonsense is found wanting as is the idea that religious uses of language should be regarded as language games. Mulhall concludes that claiming that for Wittgenstein nonsense is a pejorative term whilst maintaining that the nonsensicality of religious language is actually a theological desideratum has the consequence that a different approach to demonstrating the feasibility of Wittgensteinian method of developing philosophical Thomism must be found. At this point Mulhall has already departed from the majority of main line Wittgenstein interpretation, which regards nonsense as a term of opprobrium.

In developing this alternative stance Mulhall makes considerable use of Cora Diamond's account of nonsense in both Wittgenstein's early and late philosophy to provide a clear account of how the resolute account differs from established views of nonsense as a substantial category. What he particularly takes from Diamond is the idea that for the Tractatus the criterion of nonsense is that in any nonsensical concatenation of words there is at least one component which fails to have an attributable meaning. On this view all the forms of nonsense are nonsense because one element does not have an attributable meaning whatever the reason for the lack might be. This conception of nonsense as unified category is important in underpinning the move away from Analytical Thomism and towards the methodological resemblance of Grammatical Thomism and Wittgenstein's philosophical therapy. Due to Mulhall's heavy argumentative reliance on the resolute reading of the Tractatus, his new interpretation of nonsense in Wittgenstein would not persuade a reader not already convinced by the resolute perspective. The format of the lectures which the book originates from clearly imposes restrictions on what can be discussed; but given the centrality of the resolute reading some discussion of criticisms of this, such as those made by Hacker, would have been welcome.

In the third lecture Mulhall significantly engages with Grammatical Thomism with an explicitly critical allusion to Anthony Kenny's The Five Ways. The essential argument here is that if Diamond's account of Anselm's ontological argument on the model of a great riddle can be analogically transposed to an interpretation of Summa Theologica, then Grammatical Thomism has a plausible connection with Wittgenstein's later philosophical therapy. Mulhall explores this with particular reference to the classical cosmological question of why there is something rather than nothing and examines why such causal language is problematic. He argues that the notion of the cause of everything should not be characterised in terms of normal causal inquiry and that rather than tracing causes it would be better to accept that theologically causal terms cease to have meaning. The other strategy which Mulhall uses to deal with the problematic nature of causal language is rather more controversial in that he maintains that using Wittgensteinian concepts with inadequate critical attention could be an obstruction to recognising that there is a legitimate function for the cosmological question in the use of language. He goes on to make the point that religious uses of language should be seen as riddles which are to be pondered and as undeciphered but at the same time decipherable. For Mulhall the power of this suggestion is that conceiving of religious language in this way allows both believers and non-believers to consider the difficulty of making sense of such language as an ongoing process of both trying to reach and yet rejecting agreement on ordinary ways of articulating their meaning. As a possible way of approaching the understanding of religious language, it has the merit of recognising some of the clearly puzzling features of such talk; but it is no longer clear that these are notions of nonsense and meaning that most mainline Wittgenstein scholarship would recognise. Mulhall concludes by claiming religious language being nonsensical does not have the consequence that it no longer has a place within sense but instead that such language challenges ordinary notions of sense in the process of moving beyond them.

Such analysis of riddles is developed by a detailed consideration of what analogy might look like in the Wittgensteinian interpretative framework being developed. Mulhall combines a  Cavellian type reading of Wittgenstein's view of language and an analogical model favoured by certain Grammatical Thomists. In this account of analogy Aquinas was less concerned to propound a systematic theory of analogy than to repudiate the view that any two non-metaphorical uses of languages have to be either univocal or equivocal. In support of this Mulhall argues that employing the same concept across categories to produce an analogy does not depend on a single analogical schema. Instead it is the result of an imaginative projection of two related conceptions on to a single concept. This mechanism of grammatical schematism is both not univocal and not equivocal so Mulhall concludes that it could reasonably be thought of as analogical. This analogical mechanism allows the ordinary main sense of words to be overtaken by a kind of transcendent rearrangement of meaning that encapsulates both the ordinary and the projective theological expansion of meaning.

In moving towards perfectionism, the analysis of the analogical expansion of meaning is focused upon two kinds of religious language which are of particular concern to Grammatical Thomists, namely, perfection terms and transcendentals. At this point Mulhall's argument becomes more speculative and metaphysical since he aims to connect the projective theological expansion of meaning with moral perfectionism. He claims that perfection terms are a significant part of Wittgenstein's philosophical therapy. Mulhall argues that Wittgenstein's interest in perfectionism has some plausibility given his conversations, which indicate an interest in religion. However, this is a difficult claim to defend since there is ample evidence, such as from his later philosophy of mathematics, that Wittgenstein's professed methodology and actual writings were inconsistent. Given this it is possible that Wittgenstein was both interested in perfectionism and thought the language used to express it was nonsensical. However, Mulhall does not address this potential difficulty. Instead he moves on to the idea that moral perfectionism is extended by considering the different complex ways in which transcendental terms perform acts of unification through the exercise of analogies which range across various categorical kinds of language. In recognising this, philosophical assessment of the nature of transcendentals is viewed as being analogical in nature. For Mulhall such perfectionism and transcendentals provide a way of uniting philosophy and theology because theology fills the gaps in understanding left by philosophical inquiry. In the course of doing so he makes the relatively uncontroversial claim that good theology needs good philosophy and the considerably more contentious one that good philosophy either requires or could benefit from good theology.

As the book proceeds the overall concern with articulating the possible benefits of a closer association between philosophy and theology has the effect of gradually shifting the argument further and further away from direct textual engagement with Wittgenstein. The difficulty with this weakening textual connection is that it becomes hard to say whether what is being claimed is a really a legitimate inheritance of Wittgenstein's method as opposed to an interesting account of the notion of nonsense in its own right. However, this problem with textual connection is not peculiar to these lectures since all scholarship on Wittgenstein's philosophy of religion struggles with the paucity of direct exegetical evidence. Despite such a lack of direct textual evidence, it is not at all obvious that Mulhall is offering a natural interpretation of Wittgenstein; and indeed his account has very many features which adherents of much mainline Wittgenstein scholarship would find troubling. Whatever one might think of Mulhall's account in relation to established Wittgenstein scholarship, it contains much of interest in its own right and shows an appropriate sense of perplexity in trying to come to terms with what it might mean to understand religious language, which make it a rewarding read.