The Inquiring Mind: On Intellectual Virtues and Virtue Epistemology

Placeholder book cover

Jason Baehr, The Inquiring Mind: On Intellectual Virtues and Virtue Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 235pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199604074.

Reviewed by Andrew D. Cling, The University of Alabama in Huntsville


This is an excellent book. Baehr proposes an interesting and original account of the proper goals of a virtue theory for epistemology and makes substantive progress toward developing a theory of his own. The quality of argument is very high and Baehr's writing is elegant and clear.

The idea behind a virtue theory is this. If we have a sufficiently robust account of the proper goal, or good, of an activity, we can identify the characteristics that persons need if they are to pursue that good. The proper objects of evaluation, therefore, include not just the products of successful activity -- morally right actions (ethics) or reasonable beliefs (epistemology) -- but also the personal characteristics that are essential to that activity. These are the virtues. Furthermore, a virtue theory can guide practice. For if we know the proper goal of an activity and we can discover the states that are required to attain that goal, we might figure out how to cultivate those states. So the success of a virtue theory depends upon having a conception of the good that is robust enough to enable us to identify the states that are required for its pursuit.

Baehr defends two key claims. First, although an account of the intellectual virtues is insufficient to solve the problems of traditional epistemology, it provides resources that can contribute to solutions to those problems. Second, although the investigation of intellectual virtues cannot replace traditional epistemology, it enhances the range of epistemological research.

Chapter 1 presents an account of the positions that virtue theorists can take on the role of the intellectual virtues in epistemology. These amount to different ways of answering the questions can an account of intellectual virtue help solve traditional epistemological problems? and can a study of intellectual virtues open up new, independent areas for epistemological investigation? Virtue epistemologists who answer "yes" to the first question hold either that an account of virtue is essential to the solution of traditional problems (strong conservative virtue epistemology) or is not essential to the solution of those problems but can play an important auxiliary role in addressing them (weak conservative virtue epistemology). Virtue epistemologists who answer "yes" to the second question hold either that an account of intellectual virtue should replace the concerns of traditional epistemology (strong autonomous virtue epistemology) or that, although traditional epistemology should not be replaced, an account of intellectual virtues can usefully extend epistemology (weak autonomous virtue epistemology). Baehr defends weak conservative virtue epistemology and is cautiously optimistic about weak autonomous virtue epistemology.

Chapter 2 distinguishes between intellectual faculties, talents, skills, and virtues. A crucial difference between virtues and the other items on this list, in Baehr's view, is that virtues are states of a person that are acquired as a result of sustained action and practice. In Chapter 3, he argues that an account of the virtues is insufficient to solve the traditional problems of epistemology. He takes the analysis of knowledge to be paradigmatic of a traditional problem and argues that the exercise of intellectual virtue is neither necessary nor sufficient for knowledge. It is not necessary because some knowledge -- simple perceptual knowledge, for example -- does not require an exercise of the virtues since it is largely automatic. Even an irresponsible inquirer can have simple perceptual knowledge. Virtue is not sufficient for knowledge because one might virtuously come to believe a proposition P on the basis of tainted evidence even though P happens to be true. So strong conservative virtue epistemology fails.

Chapter 4 begins the case for weak conservative epistemology by claiming that reliabilist accounts of knowledge and justified belief need to include a consideration of the states of character that constitute the virtues. This is so, Baehr argues, because some kinds of inquiry -- history, philosophy, psychology, religion, and morality, for example -- can only arrive at the truth reliably by means of virtuous personal effort. If a reliabilist epistemology is correct, therefore, it must recognize and account for the reliability of these states of character and the inquiries they make possible. Chapter 5 argues that evidentialist accounts of justified belief also need the intellectual virtues. A key claim is that there are evidence-relevant kinds of justified belief that require intellectual virtue. For example, there are cases in which persons who have not performed actions that are characteristic of relevant virtues -- they have culpably ignored readily-available relevant evidence, for example -- lack justified beliefs. Irresponsible persons who form beliefs on the basis of the evidence available to them might be making the best of their predicament but still lack an important kind of justified belief. Some cases of justified belief do not supervene only upon the evidence a believer possesses. So, according to Baehr, reliabilist and evidentialist accounts of justified belief need an account of the intellectual virtues to explain the full range of justified beliefs. So weak conservative virtue epistemology is correct.

Chapter 6 presents Baehr's account of intellectual virtue. According to him, intellectual virtue is "a character trait that contributes to its possessor's personal intellectual worth on account of its involving a positive psychological orientation toward epistemic goods." (102, italics in original) The primary locus of evaluation is the person, not aspects of persons, and the aspects of the person that provide the basis for personal evaluation are acquired character traits, not sub-personal talents, skills, or faculties. A central feature of the account is the characteristic by means of which the intellectually virtuous person has the appropriate orientation to the good. In Baehr's view this characteristic is a positive attitude toward intellectual goods that he describes as "love" (102; his quotes) which is typically constituted by desire -- virtuous inquiring minds want to know -- but can also be a volitional state such as respect. The class of proper objects of this love is broad. Following Linda Zagzebski, Baehr picks epistemic goods out as states that give us "cognitive contact with reality," including "true belief, knowledge, and understanding." (101) This is a crucial move since, as noted above, the virtues are partially individuated by the goods at which they aim.

Chapter 7 compares Baehr's theory to other virtue theories. This chapter contains some of the most intricate distinctions and arguments in the book and my summary ignores much. Baehr considers the views of Thomas Hurka (2001), Robert Adams (2006), Julia Driver (2001), Rosalind Hursthouse (1999), and Zagzebski (1996). Hurka identifies virtues with occurrent psychological states, not stable states of character. According to Baehr, Hurka thinks the latter have no independent value. One reason Baehr rejects this is because virtuous states of character provide a basis for distinguishing between virtuous persons who fail to act rightly in particular situations and the vicious persons who, on occasion, act from the motives characteristic of virtue.

An interesting difference between Baehr's view and Adams' concerns the question of whether persons lacking in overall personal worth can nevertheless have a particular virtue. For example, can a person who lacks the right orientation to the good possess the virtue of courage? Adams thinks the answer is "yes" and explains the possibility in terms of the role that this state would play in a person with the correct orientation. Baehr argues that although persons with improper orientations can have courage, it is not a virtue in these cases. For if the value of courage is to be explained in terms of the role that it could play in a person with the proper orientation, it seems to follow that courage is also a vice, since it would make a person with an improper orientation worse.

Driver's view focuses on the reliability of the virtues. Baehr is happy to agree that reliable states are virtues, but thinks they are virtues of a different sort. We do care about whether or not our character traits are reliable, but our worth as persons does not depend upon reliability since this is a matter of luck. (In Chapter 4 he deals, in a similar way, with the views of epistemologists such as Alvin Goldman (1992), Ernest Sosa (1991), and John Greco (2002).) So where virtue is a feature of personal worth, it does not require the actual reliability of our stable character states, merely "areasonable belief to the effect that the activity characteristic of this virtue is a reliable way of achieving one's epistemic goals." (126, Baehr's emphasis)

Baehr rejects Hursthouse's attempt to ground an account of virtue in a naturalistic account of human nature. Baehr thinks the focus on humans is unduly narrow -- hence his focus on persons -- and, so he argues, Hursthouse cannot provide a suitably naturalized account of the crucial concept of rationality.

Baehr's view was inspired by Zagzebski's, so his account of the differences between their views is especially intricate. One point of difference is that Baehr rejects Zagzebski's view that intellectual virtues are both intrinsically valuable -- in the strong sense that their value does not depend upon the value of anything else -- and valuable because of their reliability. As seen above, Baehr thinks that reliability is valuable, but this is not relevant to personal worth. Against the other aspect of Zagzebski's theory, Baehr holds that virtues derive their value from the contribution they make to the personal worth of the agent. Crucially, this contribution is not causal, but "intentional": "A love of knowledge is good . . . not just because of its causal relation to the goal of knowledge, but also because of its intentional relation to this goal." (137, Baehr's emphasis) So Baehr holds that the love of knowledge is intrinsically valuable because it is partly constitutive of personal excellence and fully excellent persons love knowledge for its own sake, even under circumstances in which luck prevents them from effectively pursuing their goal.

Chapters 8 and 9 give accounts of particular intellectual virtues: open-mindedness (Chapter 8) and intellectual courage (Chapter 9). Open-mindedness, according to Baehr, is not essentially a matter of fairly adjudicating between conflicting beliefs. Instead, it is a matter of detaching oneself from one's commitments, not only to consider alternatives to one's own view or to fairly adjudicate a dispute but also to imagine or conceive ways of thinking about matters where no accounts of the data are available. Intellectual courage is the disposition to persist in inquiry despite the fact that in doing so one accepts threats to one's own well-being. Chapter 10 sketches the future of virtue epistemology and the book concludes with an appendix which describes the relationship between moral and intellectual virtue. Baehr argues that these are distinct because they have different objects. Still, a token of an intellectual virtue can also be a moral virtue when it includes the relevant other-regarding motive. So, for example, against the charge that intellectual virtues must be self-directed and, at best, amoral, Baehr points out that this ignores the fact that we sometimes pursue knowledge and understanding for the sake of benefiting others by enhancing their understanding.

My brief summary of Baehr's position fails to do justice to the admirable intricacy and carefulness of his arguments. He is invariably clear and thorough in his consideration of the range of issues he discusses and his evaluation of alternative views is fair-minded and careful. I am especially impressed with his ability to compress his very ambitious book into a comparatively small space without sacrifice of rigor. Readers will find engaging arguments in every section of this interesting and important book. The book will be especially helpful not only to practitioners of virtue epistemology, but also to professional philosophers who, like me, have tended to focus on traditional epistemological problems and have been skeptical of the benefits of an account of intellectual virtue. Because of its clarity and accessibility, the book can also be recommended for use in graduate and undergraduate courses in epistemology.

Let me conclude with some critical remarks and ideas for further research. The latter might be particularly relevant since it is clear that Baehr's book is intended to provide a framework for further investigation.

Baehr is right to reject strong conservative virtue epistemology -- the idea that the traditional problems of epistemology require an account of the intellectual virtues -- since one of the crucial intellectual goods on his list is knowledge itself. But if a good to be pursued by an intellectually good person is itself knowledge and the virtues are to be understood as the states that are relevantly related to that goal, we cannot give an informative account of knowledge in terms of intellectual virtues. For if the virtues are understood to be stable character states that are relevantly related to knowledge, a definition of knowledge in terms of intellectual virtue would amount to the claim that knowledge is the product of stable states of character that are related in the relevant way to knowledge, an uninformative circle. Baehr's weak conservatism avoids this problem, for he rightly notes that there seem to be instances of knowledge that do not require the exercise of intellectual virtue. It seems that I can know that there is something blue in front of me without exercising any of the motives that are essential to intellectual virtue, for example. But Baehr might have strengthened his case for weak conservatism by noting this conceptual problem for any virtue epistemology that takes knowledge to be a good that is one of the proper goals of epistemic practice. Indeed, this problem would appear to plague any strong conservative virtue theory that describes the relevant goods using terms of positive epistemic evaluation.

Baehr's decision to take the analysis of knowledge as paradigmatic of a traditional epistemological problem is problematic. No doubt that problem has been extensively explored since the publication of Gettier's seminal paper (1963), but over the long history of epistemology this problem has not been a central concern. A better candidate for the paradigmatic concern of traditional epistemology is accounting for the nature and possibility of evidence-providing reasons for belief. This problem is essential to the attempt to provide practical guidelines for effective inquiry. It is also at the heart of the related problem of responding to the challenges of ancient skepticism -- the problem of the criterion and the epistemic regress problem are especially important -- and of Cartesian skepticism's challenge to our ability to have good reasons in the face of the possibility of error, including the possibility of systematic deception. These genuine problems strengthen the case against strong conservatism. For unless it is possible to account for an evidence-providing reason only in terms of the exercise of intellectual virtue, strong conservative virtue epistemology must fail. It seems unlikely that such an account can succeed, however, since it seems to be essential to an intellectual virtue that it be responsive to evidence-providing reasons, so the concept of a reason is more fundamental. Baehr comes close to recognizing this connection when he notes that "I have argued at a couple of points that intellectual virtues involve a kind or element of epistemic rationality or reasonability." (203) If epistemic rationality or reasonability is a matter of making proper use of evidence-providing reasons, then the prospects for strong conservative virtue epistemology are dim. The same goes for both strong and weak autonomous virtue epistemology. If accounts of the intellectual virtues are parasitic upon the concept of evidence-providing reasons, then virtue epistemology might be able to extend the range of epistemological inquiry but it is unlikely that it can do so in a way that is fully autonomous, for it must make essential use of concepts in the purview of traditional epistemology.

Finally, although Baehr has read widely and carefully in the literature on epistemic and moral virtue, there are several authors whose work might help to deepen and extend his approach: Alasdair MacIntyre (1981) and Charles Taylor (1989). MacIntyre's work on virtue ethics has been at the forefront of contemporary efforts to make the virtues central to ethics, yet Baehr does not discuss it. MacIntyre's distinction between internal and external goods seems to be especially relevant to Baehr's claim that there are some forms of knowledge that require the exercise of intellectual virtue since it is characteristic of internal goods that they can only be acquired by means of cultivating the virtues that make shared practices possible. So, in the case of the intellectual virtues one might argue that, at least for the non-automatic cases of knowledge, the exercise of intellectual virtue is partly constitutive of the very intellectual goal that is the proper good of inquiry. This might provide a way of explaining how it can be that a purely intentional relation to the good -- merely wanting knowledge for its own sake, whether or not that desire is effective -- can be a basis for personal excellence. Charles Taylor's provocative view that a self is essentially constituted by an orientation to the good provides additional resources for further development of an idea that provides the grounding for any virtue theory: a sufficiently robust conception of the good and our relationship to it. It might also be used to explain how it can be that merely loving the good for its own sake is intrinsically good.

I thoroughly enjoyed reading this book and thinking about its provocative arguments. Although I am skeptical that a focus on intellectual virtue will be able to replace the traditional problems of epistemology -- especially the problem of accounting for evidence-providing reasons for belief -- I am persuaded that virtue theory provides resources for enriching and extending work on those problems. Baehr's book provides him with an excellent basis for being at the forefront of this work.[1]


Adams, Robert (2006). A Theory of Virtue. Oxford.

Driver, Julia (2001). Uneasy Virtue. Cambridge.

Gettier, Edmund (1963). "Is Justified Belief Knowledge?" Analysis.

Goldman, Alvin (1992). Liasons: Philosophy Meets the Cognitive and Social Sciences. MIT.

Greco, John (2002). "Virtues in Epistemology," in Paul Moser (ed.) Oxford Handbook of Epistemology. Oxford.

Hurka, Thomas (2001). Virtue, Vice, and Value. Oxford.

Hursthouse, Rosalind (1999). On Virtue Ethics. Oxford.

MacIntyre, Alasdair (1981). After Virtue. Notre Dame.

Sosa, Ernest (1991). Knowledge in Perspective. Cambridge.

Taylor, Charles (1989) Sources of the Self: The Making of the Modern Identity. Harvard.

Zagzebski, Linda (1996). Virtues of the Mind. Cambridge.

[1] I am very grateful to my colleague Nicholaos Jones for especially helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.