The Institutions of Meaning: A Defense of Anthropological Holism

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Vincent Descombes, The Institutions of Meaning: A Defense of Anthropological Holism, Stephen Adam Schwartz (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2014, xxix + 360 pages, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674728783.

Reviewed by Jocelyn Benoist, University Paris 1 Panthéon-Sorbonne


This is the English translation by Stephen Adam Schwartz of Vincent Descombes’ Les Institutions du Sens (Paris, Editions de Minuit, 1996). It is the sequel to The Mind’s Provisions: A Critique of Cognitivism, also translated into English by Schwartz (Princeton University Press, 2001; French original version: La Denrée Mentale, Paris, Editions de Minuit, 1995). The two books should be considered together as a whole, to which the author himself gave the title of The Disputes of Mind.

This impressive work is indeed a major contribution to the philosophy of mind. Perhaps the cognitivist wave is not as powerful today as it was twenty years ago, which may render the ‘dispute’ less intense nowadays, but the concept of mind provided by the author is no less topical. The book is certainly a central work in contemporary philosophy of mind, and it is a very good thing that it has been translated into English.

A few words should be said first about the author, who is a major contemporary French philosopher. This matters because to some extent the book, in its synthetic objective, is very French. Very few English-speaking authors would adopt such a systematic perspective about the mind — not because they are unable to do so, but because they are suspicious of the very idea.

On the other hand, Descombes is in many regards unique in the field of contemporary French philosophy: though he definitely belongs to the French tradition and pursues an enduring dialogue with it, he has a strong background in English-language analytic philosophy as well. As a matter of fact, what makes his work so particular is the friction between the two traditions. Descombes, who has had a long experience with America — he has taught at Johns Hopkins and Emory University, and is a regular visiting professor at the University of Chicago — has been going against the mainstream of French contemporary thought (so-called ‘post-structuralism’) for many years. Indeed, he has become one of its major opponents. One important dimension of his theoretical stance is his systematic opposition to so-called ‘French theory.’ Thus, Descombes stands out in the context of contemporary French thought: both what it is itself and what it is supposed to be, and how it is received in the English-speaking world. At the same time, his particular stance has its roots in debates internal to the French tradition. Thus, Descombes’ work also stands out in the context of mainstream English-speaking philosophy.

In many respects, the two volumes of The Disputes of Mind are Descombes’ masterwork, the work in which he systematizes his views. Since writing this book he has published, among other works, an important book about the problem of subjectivity, Le complément du sujet (Paris, Gallimard, 2004). However, the latter should be understood only against the background of the philosophy of mind set forth in the former. It reads like an attempt to analyze ‘subjective mind,’ whereas Disputes provides us with an analysis of ‘objective mind.’ The central claim of Disputes is the logical priority of objective mind over subjective mind.

This claim is developed positively in the second part of Disputes, to which I am about to turn. In The Mind’s Provisions, Descombes criticized psychological atomism, which sees the mind as built out of ‘representations.’ Thus, he questioned the basis of cognitivism, whose naturalism is usually based on a representationalist conception of the mind, which is taken to be made of discrete entities — ‘representations’ — to which, it is claimed, there correspond an equal number of physical (neural) equivalents.

After this mental atomism has been destabilized, some other positive determination of the mind is needed. If the mind is not made out of discrete, isolable entities, what is it? In The Institutions of Meaning, the author attempts to answer this question by developing what he calls a holism of mind.

The path that Descombes then takes within the philosophy of mind is particularly interesting, especially because he clarifies the sense in which the mind as such is essentially social, thus building a strong connection between the philosophy of mind and social science. In this regard, Descombes’ point is very strong: he does not state that something that could be defined in non-social terms turns out to be social after all; rather, he draws our attention to the fact that the mind is social by definition. Thus, sociality is not something that befalls the mind, either as a catastrophe or as a welcome surprise, and to a certain extent, to say that the mind is social (as is so often said in post-modern rhetoric as well) is to say nothing, since this does not ascribe any property to the mind. In other words, being social does not change anything about the mind; it is just its structure to be so.

The book starts by addressing the problem of intentionality. Descombes endorses an intentionalist conception of mind — that is to say, a conception that defines the mind by intentionality. However, he distinguishes two kinds of ‘intentionalism’: one, internalist in its principle, that stems from Brentano’s school, and another, found in Peirce’s and Wittgenstein’s writings, that highlights the solidarity between so-called intentional relations and external ‘real’ relations. The author embraces the second kind of intentionalism. In this subtle discussion that provides the reader with a brilliant synthesis of the debates on intentionality in the twentieth century, Descombes gives pride of place to the problem of the so-called intentional passive. If intentionality is defined, as it is in the Brentanian tradition, by some kind of unconditional transitivity, it seems pivotal to understand the nature of that special transitivity. Hence the question: what happens to the object? If the so-called transitivity of mental attitudes is not only formal, but also substantial, as the Brentanian tradition seems to claim it is, a meaningful passive form should respond to the transitive form. So, we should ask under which conditions it might change something for Juliet to be loved — and just to be loved — by Romeo.

One possible deflationary position would consist in saying that it does not ever change anything for her. Only an inveterate idealism can tempt us to believe that it could. There is no genuine intentional passive, but merely formal passivation of the intentional form.

The French intentionalists would surely be very unhappy with such a deflation. However, this is not exactly Descombes’ position. He certainly does not buy into any magical causal effectiveness of the ‘intentional act’ by itself, understood as an isolated performance of consciousness. He nevertheless believes in the effectiveness of intentional attitudes, inasmuch as under certain conditions they give real meaning to their objects. However, to make sense of that, one should first jettison the mythology of the isolated intentional act: such an ‘act’ always takes place within a grammar that relates it to other acts. There is no isolated intentional performance, but rather a system of intentional verbs, in which what we do takes on a certain meaning. For instance, seeking is not grammatically independent from finding. Second, it is an essential fact that those intentional verbs are connected to verbs that describe relations that are not intentional, but are mere real relations. The fact that we sometimes run into a person without looking for her plays a role in the grammar of the expression ‘looking for someone,’ which typically characterizes an intentional activity.

Thus, Descombes’ claim is that there is only intentionality within a system of intentional attitudes, and that every such system is tightly connected with many relations to reality that are not intentional. As a result of such analysis, and against the Brentanian ‘Cartesian’ approach, intentionality ceases to be a kingdom within a kingdom. At the same time, it becomes possible to make sense of the intentional passive and of the very idea of an intentional history of objects: insofar as intentional relations are essentially combined with real relations, they have real intentional effects. It might be really important and make a difference in reality that some object is named a certain way at a certain time and another way at another time. However, this makes a real difference only because at each time, naming supposes a real relation to the named object as well. Thus, that object and not another is indeed named a certain way at a certain time, and another way at another time. Every intentional history of objects supposes their reality, not the other way around.

Descombes characterizes this approach to intentionality as holistic because according to this view there is no intentional attitude except within a relational nexus.

‘Holism’ here is defined by the primacy of relations. Although Descombes shows the kind of internal relation that intentionality is to be efficient only insofar as it involves some internal relation to certain external relations, his analysis requires as a precondition that there be such things as internal relations. He addresses this traditional issue, returning to the debate over the doctrine of relations that characterized early analytic philosophy. He develops a criticism of logical atomism and questions the reading of Leibniz advocated by Russell. Following in Peirce’s footsteps, he points to the irreducibility of those relations that cannot be built up by mere addition of what happens at the level of individuals. Still drawing upon the resources of Peirce’s logic, he goes a step further: he defends the irreducibility of triadic relations to dyadic relations.

This point is absolutely pivotal because the backbone of Descombes’ criticism of phenomenological intentionalism is that it interprets mental phenomena in general within a dyadic framework, as if the paradigm for mental phenomenon were to be found in the allegedly mirror relation between a thought and its object. On the contrary, Descombes characterizes every intentional attitude by its belonging to an intentional order made out of triadic relations.

On this view, Peirce’s logic of triadic relations becomes the theoretical framework adequate for analyzing intentional phenomena.

It is noteworthy that according to this analysis giving becomes the paradigmatic intentional act, since it essentially involves a triadic relation: to give is to give something to someone. This is even more interesting because phenomenological intentionalism usually rests on the concept of givenness (‘being given’), but this is understood as a dyadic relation — as if no other were involved. Thus it is possible to make a sharp contrast between the two brands of intentionalism on the basis of their respective syntax of ‘giving’: one remains true to the natural syntax of the verb, whereas the other twists it philosophically.

Triadicity, in Descombes’ analysis, is also the appropriate logical framework for making sense of the essential sociality of intentional phenomena. For instance, giving is something one cannot do by oneself: one needs another in order to be able to give something to that other. Now, it is essential that, in this story, each of the agents involved does something that she could not do by herself: one gives, the other receives. What makes possible for each to do what she does is the social relation of giving in which they stand to one another.

The surplus of the social relation that makes an individual subject capable of effecting ‘social acts’ plays a central role in Descombes’ holism, as social holism. Different subjects can do ‘the same thing’ not only in the sense that each of them does something that the others happen to do as well — identity of type — but in the sense that they really do something together, something that they cannot do by themselves, because it would not make sense for one to do by oneself. The latter impossibility is not physical — it is not that one would not be strong enough to do it by oneself — but logical. For instance, it is logically impossible to promise anything by oneself. Thus, the social world is made of meanings that no solitary subject can provide. Those meanings are essentially determined by relations in which individuals are not interchangeable but acquire definite statuses.

Thus, the gist of so-called ‘holism’ is that it is impossible to determine what an individual does at the intentional level without re-placing him or her within a complex whole: a specific social situation, which in turn makes sense only within the context of a whole range of social relations and attitudes.

It is, however, very important to keep in mind that this is a grammatical, i.e., logical, thesis. ‘The social,’ as it describes the actions and thoughts of individuals, does not determine them as an external force, as social determinism would have it. There is nothing like a collective entity — ‘Society’ — that would behave as a higher order individual and, as it were, conflict with individuals. To some extent, methodological individualism is right: society is made of individuals. However, it misses the fact that those individuals have essentially social properties. Descombes cannot see the intentional order, as social order, as anything external to individuals or ‘transcendent’ to them, but instead sees it as the very order of their lives and actions, insofar as, precisely, there is order in them. From this point of view, it just makes no sense to say that individuals are ‘constrained’ by a structure. They are obliged by it as a consequence of their merely being social, which is substantially different.

Indeed, Descombes rejects any foundation of sociality on a more basic sense of subjectivity. Sociality is not the result of our personal mental activity, but is instead its condition and its framework. Thus, Descombes endorses a philosophy of ‘objective mind’ in the Hegelian sense of the term. He draws a precious distinction between that ‘objective mind’ and any kind of ‘objectified mind’ that would come down to a subjective mind, so to speak, deposited by the subject(s) in the objects, as in the hermeneutical theory of ‘objects endowed with spirit.’ The objective mind is not the mere trace of subjectivity. It consists in the norms with which subjects have to comply in a given society.

At the same time, ‘objective mind’ should not be substantialized and made an entity in itself, as in theories of the ‘structural Unconscious.’ It is no entity. It is made of rules that have no sense other than to govern the actions of individuals. From this point of view, there is no Society transcendent to individuals, or, to some extent, if there is a transcendence of society, that transcendence is more ‘logical’ than metaphysical. The truth is that individuals themselves are social. Sociality exerts no causal constraint on our actions: sociality is the logical form of those actions; it is what qualifies them as ‘actions.’

Thus, Descombes rejects both the phenomenological or hermeneutical subjectivist stance and full-blooded structuralist anti-subjectivism. Against that false dilemma, he tries to make sense of the order of subjects. For instance, contrary to a certain mythology of structuralism, the language we speak never constrains us to say anything in particular; but, if we want to say anything, we have to say it in that language. Now, this language is an institution, and if we do not play by its rules, we cannot say anything — it is logically impossible for us to say anything. In this regard, the social holism Descombes advocates is ontological insofar as it is logical.

It is, however, epistemological as well. Or at least it should be. The self-proclaimed objective of the book is to clarify what it takes to understand what a certain agent thinks on a certain occasion. Now, it seems that the epistemological holism advocated could make this difficult, since in order to make sense of what a given agent thinks, I would have to master the complete system of relations into which I should re-place this agent. How could this be ever possible?

In the end, Descombes comes up with an answer to this challenge of ‘radical translation’: ‘talk to her/him!’ He observes that in the Quinean setting of ‘radical translation’ the translator is no mere observer; a linguistic interaction — primitive as it might be — takes place between her/him and the informer. Thus, interlocution is revealed as the key to all sociality.

At this point I am tempted to introduce a critical remark. This analysis, like the book in general, is certainly illuminating, in particular because it sheds new light on what is definitely not empiricist in Quine’s account of meaning. However it may raise as many questions as it answers. Because, of course, the question now is: how can I talk to someone whose language I do not share? Descombes’ answer seems to be that a language is essentially something I can learn. To some extent, Quine’s thought-experiment with its ‘radical’ setting is exactly the proof of that: it does not reveal an impossibility as much as a possibility in spite of everything.

Nevertheless, it is not entirely clear how Descombes’ holism can deal with the problem of learning, since, according to that perspective, the meaning of any particular concept seems to depend on the complete system to which this concept belongs. Thus, how could I acquire the concept without having already acquired the system? And so how can I ever acquire the system? The participative solution advocated by Descombes (’let’s talk’) seems to make me always already part of the system, which I am not. Or is there any kind of minimal system we participate in no matter what, as speakers? Are there universals of language, such as assent or dissent? What makes interlocution in general possible? Since one would be tempted to say that it is the use of the same language, i.e., the participation in the same system of rules, it comes necessarily as a surprise to read that it is the other way around: interlocution should, in some cases, make such common participation possible. Or maybe some kind of circle is to be found and accepted: interlocution is proof that there is already some kind of common participation (but what kind?) and, at the same time, it makes deeper participation always possible. I have no problem with this idea, but I would like it to be made more specific. As it stands, it seems that the discussion of interlocution remains too sketchy in Descombes’ book; the real conditions of interlocution are not addressed within its limits. As a matter of fact, at a certain point he promises another book, entitled L’enquête radicale (Radical Inquiry). I would like to imagine that in this book some answers will be given to these questions.

This first critical remark leads to another. The Institutions of Meaning, as a book, does not belong to the philosophy of language. It deals with the mind in general, and thus with the social being of humans, disclosed as the real locus of mind. Nevertheless, in all its analyses, language plays a pivotal role: language, understood as ‘a language,’ is the paradigm of an institution.

From this point of view the sharp criticism of Sartre’s subjectivist use of a primitive notion of speech act is noteworthy. Of course, Descombes is right: we speak with words so that they mean something in a language. Without language as an institution, it is impossible to say anything. However, it seems to me that in this regard the discussion remains deeply determined by a polarity typical of the post-World War Two French debate about language: as if the relevant opposition were between the alleged subjectivity of speech (‘parole’) and the objectivity of spoken language, understood as ‘langue,’ i.e., code.

It seems to me that one cannot buy this contrast like that, and that it is not satisfactory to reduce the objectivity of language to its being a code. Speech acts as such have rules, which do not come down to the semantic rules of ‘the language’ in which they are performed. When dealing with language it seems on the whole incorrect to sacrifice the point of view of performance on the grounds that some philosophers have given a metaphysical subjectivist interpretation of that performance. A lot of different rules apply to what people do when they speak. Not all of them pertain to the system of signs (‘la langue’) used as such. Thus, what is not encoded in that system does not necessarily relapse into sheer subjectivity. On the contrary, the contemporary philosophy of language after Austin has taught us to see a genuine diversity of normative dimensions in language.

I think that this remark about the philosophy of language in the background of this book can be connected to a more general feature of it.  Descombes’ book is a decisive contribution to the contemporary debate about the mind as it has evolved since the Second World War, in particular in the English-speaking world. At the same time, it belongs to the tradition of twentieth-century French philosophy towards which it is critically oriented. Thus, it is deeply determined by the system of oppositions derived from that tradition. As a consequence, the debate about the subjectivity (or not) of mind is foremost in the construction of the book. For an audience not familiar with French thought, this makes the book even more instructive. It nevertheless raises an issue, because one may doubt whether criticism of subjectivism always provides the best perspective on the nature of mind.

The point of the book — that the mind is social all the way down — is very well made and is very convincing. What, however, is the real status of this assertion? Personally, I am inclined to think, following a Wittgensteinian perspective, that it is essentially tautological. To say so just amounts to drawing our attention to the logical structure of thought, which is never specular, but always involves an element of thirdness. In this regard Descombes’ analysis is truly illuminating. However, it sometimes seems that the claim should be more substantial. As if subjectivity should experience sociality as a limit, and something happened to thought by its becoming social — if only that it really becomes a thought.

In other words, the question is the following: is the objectivity of thought to be understood as a kind of limitation to subjectivity, or is it merely the format of that subjectivity? Descombes’ book sometimes seems to hesitate between both options, perhaps because it is determined by a reaction to a brand of extreme subjectivism. However, why should we believe in the first place that thought is ‘subjective’ in that abstract sense of the term? If we don’t, it is not clear that the polarity on which the book hinges remains so absolutely relevant. To choose ‘objective mind’ over ‘subjective mind’ supposes that one clings to a polarity — one that may only make sense from the point of view of a certain misguided philosophy of subjectivity. In this regard, it remains tempting to interpret the philosophy of mind Descombes sets forth here as some kind of reversal of the subjectivist framework, which would grant some validity to the system of oppositions that define this framework.

What should a philosophy of mind freed from that tension be? A philosophy that would define mind neither by subjectivity nor against it? Descombes’ book, insofar as it adopts a resolutely analytic perspective, promises a breakthrough in this direction. However, therapy, as ever, is difficult, and it is not always certain that one metaphysics is not peeping out here as a substitute for another: a metaphysics of the social instead of a metaphysics of the subject, as it were.

It is clear that this book is a milestone in the contemporary philosophy of mind and should absolutely be read by every philosopher or scientist interested in the nature of the mind today. It pursues an intense debate with contemporary cognitivism and with Continental theories and ‘deconstruction’ of mind, and develops a totally unique perspective at the crossroads of the Analytic and French traditions. Maybe, like every polemical work, it depends a bit too much on what it criticizes. However, beyond the polemic, it seems to me that this book does indeed promise a new philosophy of mind that defines the mind by itself and no longer by any transcendent principle — either ‘the Subject’ or ‘Society’ — that in a sense would not already be mindful. Thus, it seems to me that we should read this book as a plea for the non-metaphysical irreducibility of the mind. And what do we need more today than a non-metaphysical (I have not said: anti-metaphysical) anti-reductionism?