The Philosophical Rupture between Fichte and Schelling: Selected Texts and Correspondence (1800-1802)

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J. G. Fichte and F. W. J. Schelling, The Philosophical Rupture between Fichte and Schelling: Selected Texts and Correspondence (1800-1802), Michael Vater and David W. Wood (eds. and trs.), State University of New York Press, 2012, 301pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438440170.

Reviewed by Dale Snow, Loyola University Maryland


The title of this book is well chosen, because it evokes the magnitude of the split between Fichte and Schelling, which could be described as one of the watershed moments of German Idealism. The book presents an unparalleled opportunity to observe an important set of their philosophical exchanges and has the potential to affect one's understanding of post-Kantian philosophy in a lasting way. If I had one quibble with this thought-provoking collection, it would be with the subtitle, which refers to texts and correspondence, although the actual book places the correspondence before the texts. The correspondence has not previously been translated into English, despite its importance. The four short texts of Fichte's are also translated for the first time, and include Fichte's commentaries on Schelling's System of Transcendental Idealism (1800) and Presentation of My System of Philosophy. These last texts are perhaps of particular interest since Schelling more than once accused Fichte of not having read his work. The Schelling texts had been previously published in part, but were not easily accessible.

The genius of this volume lies in the selection of texts. The book opens with an epigraph from Hegel's The Difference between Fichte's and Schelling's System of Philosophy, and this difference, simply, is the topic of the book. It is, of course, a subject of long-standing interest and debate. Schelling's son, K. F. A. Schelling, writes in 1859, in his preface to the fourth volume of the collected works, that it would certainly be of interest to compare the "Presentation of My System" to Fichte and Schelling's correspondence, since the preface in particular seems directed at Fichte, and to be part of a conversation that culminates in Schelling's Bruno. (I,4,v) Vater and Wood have made that possible for Anglophone readers. They have further enriched the conversation by choosing texts which, in Fichte's case in particular, seem to give us a glimpse of Fichte in the process of thinking through some of these issues.

The editors explain that they have placed the correspondence first in part to provide a context for the texts that follow, but caution that this choice is not to be understood as a declaration that the correspondence has "explanatory priority or because the cultural and biographical situations they reference illuminate the 'difference' better than the published works" (2). They also decline to point to any exchange or text as singularly definitive in this matter, leaving this to the reader in the hope that the texts will speak for themselves.

The editors provide a wide-ranging introductory essay that sketches the state of German intellectual life after Kant. They succeed very well at re-creating the atmosphere in which so many were able to conclude that despite -- or perhaps because of -- Kant's grand achievement, there was still vitally important additional work to be done. It was in this context that Fichte and Schelling understood themselves as engaged in what was essentially the same important project: the completion of what Kant had begun. There are also sections dealing with the atheism controversy in which Fichte found himself embroiled in 1799 as well as the evolution of Schelling's views on religion. Finally, the essay offers three candidates for "the difference" between Schelling and Fichte, a difference to which both refer but neither defines. It may be that this part of the essay, intended as introduction, will take on new meaning after reading the actual correspondence.

The Traub edition, the most recent and accessible one volume edition of the correspondence between Fichte and Schelling, contains 35 letters and two drafts of letters; the editors of the present volume have chosen to translate 22 letters and one draft of a letter. They have not, in my view wisely, reproduced Traub's practice of summarizing the contents of a missing letter and inserting this summary into the sequence of the actual correspondence where the missing letter ought to have been. Instead, where at least some content can be inferred, they relay this information in the endnotes. Their selection only omits the earlier (and friendlier) exchanges from the beginning of Fichte and Schelling's acquaintance in 1794 to 1799.

The introduction to Fichte's texts sets the scene briefly: in 1799, Fichte first lost his professorship at the University of Jena under very unpleasant circumstances and then had to accept the public repudiation of the Wissenschaftslehre by both Jacobi and Kant. It is therefore unsurprising that the 1800 Announcement (of a new version of the Wissenschaftslehre) is written in a tone that manages to be both combative and defensive. Fichte writes as if he feels himself embattled and alone, and even the seemingly neutral comment "I will not here discuss the extent to which my talented collaborator, Professor Schelling, has been more successful at paving the way for the transcendental standpoint" (86) was understood as tantamount to a vote of no confidence by Schelling. On the one hand, it could be read as an understandable reluctance to engage with other, extraneous issues in the context of a brief announcement for a forthcoming publication. However, other comments in the Announcement, such as the observation that "since Kant some of the more outstanding minds in this domain have continued to speak past each other," (91), must have seemed at best odd to Schelling, since Fichte's letters to him in October and November of that year make repeated reference to the importance and necessity of collaborating on editing a journal together. If he, Schelling, was still Fichte's choice as co-editor, why was this not acknowledged?

Schelling's estrangement from Fichte has often been seen as a gradual development. According to this narrative, the young acolyte and true believer slowly found his own voice and began to distance himself from Fichte, a distance increasing roughly parallel to the development of the philosophy of nature, without any one definitive break. There is a certain plausibility to this account, since a number of conflicts do seem to be connected with the importance Schelling assigned to the philosophy of nature, which in turn points the way to an entire constellation of related disagreements. For example, in the first letter in which he directly mentions the System of Transcendental Idealism, Fichte says point-blank:

I still do not agree with your opposition between transcendental philosophy and philosophy of nature. Everything seems to be based on a confusion between ideal and real activity, which we have both occasionally made; and which I hope to completely clarify in my new presentation . . .  Science only makes nature into its object through a subtle abstraction, and obviously has to posit nature as something absolute (precisely because it abstracts from the intelligence), and lets nature construct itself by means of a fiction" (42).

Nature, if it has to be posited as absolute, is not nature as an independent reality. For Fichte, then, the philosophy of nature is not a reflection on an independent reality but is at best a reflection on the kinds of fictions the mind constructs in order to represent nature. Of course any and all of Fichte's objections to the philosophy of nature need to be put into perspective; as late as October of 1800, Fichte wrote to Schelling: "It almost costs me more effort to work my way into a foreign system than to construct my own. Hence, with regard to the philosophy of nature it has always been and still is my intention to somehow or other work through it myself. I will then be able to correctly understand and pass judgment on your work" (31).

There is a lull in what had been a fairly regular correspondence in the spring of 1801, during the time when Schelling was finishing the pointedly named Presentation of My System of Philosophy. In this work it is evident that the independence and primacy of nature has become so clear to Schelling that it is presupposed in other criticisms which seem to clearly be aimed at Fichte: "But how is it possible for anything to separate itself from this absolute totality or be separated from it in thought, is a question that cannot be answered here, since in its stead we prove that such a separation is intrinsically impossible, that it is false from the standpoint of reason, indeed (as can readily be seen) the source of all errors" (p. 153-154).

The translation achieves a colloquial informality appropriate to a correspondence which contains letters written in haste, in anger, and often in bemusement. The tone of the published texts is more formal, and Schelling's Presentation and Further Presentations in particular are so abstract that simply producing grammatical sentences is a triumph. The New Version of the Wissenschaftslehre, an unfinished text written after Fichte's departure from Jena, and presumably the work the Announcement is referring to, was not published in Fichte's lifetime, appearing only in 1979 in the critical edition of his works, and ought to be of particular interest to Fichte scholars. As with Fichte's unpublished commentaries on Schelling, the translators employ a nuanced use of ellipses, italics, and em-dashes to convey the conversation Fichte seems to be having with himself. Vater and Wood include a detailed index and selected bibliography. One of their most valuable contributions is clearly the notes, which occupy 37 pages and are separately numbered for each section of the book, which partially conceals their total length.

This well-conceived and carefully edited volume shines a bright light on a crucial and formative time in the lives of both Fichte and Schelling. Here is ample evidence for the conclusion that the two were initially in close agreement but ultimately grew apart; yet it is hard not to sympathize to some extent with the Fichte who suspects that Schelling never understood him at all. The editors are also successful in using this controversy to trace some of the fault lines and persistent conflicts in German Idealism more generally. For both reasons it should be of interest to scholars as well as open-minded individuals of any background seeking a path to understanding either of these notoriously difficult figures. No victor is declared, and perhaps none can be; however it is a considerable achievement to have so compellingly facilitated a better understanding of what was at stake.


Fichte, J. G. Gesamtausgabe der bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, eds. Reinhard Lauth, Hans Jacobs, Hans Gliwitzky, Erich Fuchs et. al., Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Frommann-Holzboog, 1964-2012.

Hegel, G. W. F. The Difference between Fichte's and Schelling's System of Philosophy, tr. H. S. Harris and Walter Cerf, Albany: State University of New York Press (1977).

Schelling, F. W. J., Presentation of My System of Philosophy (1801), tr. Michael Vater, in: Philosophical Forum 32 (2001), 339-71.

Schelling, F. W. J., Further Presentations from the System of Philosophy (1802), tr. Michael Vater, in: Philosophical Forum 32 (2001), 373-97.

Schelling, F. W. J. Schellings Werke, ed. Manfred Schröter, Munich: Beck, 1927.

Traub, Hartmut, ed. Schelling-Fichte Briefwechsel, Martinsreid: ars una Verlagsgesellschaft (2001).