The Point of View of the Universe: Sidgwick and Contemporary Ethics

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Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek and Peter Singer, The Point of View of the Universe: Sidgwick and Contemporary Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2014, 403pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603695.

Reviewed by Bart Schultz, University of Chicago


This book might well represent the most significant statement and defense of act utilitarianism since the 19th century, when the classical utilitarianism of Bentham, Mill, and Sidgwick became the spirit of the age. Indeed, in many respects, it marks a crucial return to classical utilitarianism in its finest flowering. The authors, one a rising star and one the North Star of philosophical utilitarianism, are as clear as can be that progress in philosophical ethics involves a return to Sidgwick, the late Victorian-era Cambridge University academic and author of The Methods of Ethics (1874):

we have followed the main lines of Sidgwick's thinking about ethics, and tested his views both against our own reasoning and against the best of the vast body of recent and current philosophical writing on the topics he addresses. The overarching question we have sought to answer is whether Sidgwick's form of utilitarianism can be defended. In most respects we believe it can be. Parfit's claim that, in the long tradition of ethics, "Sidgwick's book contains the largest number of true and important claims" stand up well. (378)

Restoring Sidgwick to his rightful place of philosophical honor and cogently defending his central positions are obviously no small tasks, but the authors are remarkably successful in pulling them off, in a defense that, in the case of Singer at least, means candidly acknowledging that previous defenses of Hare's universal prescriptivism and of a desire or preference satisfaction theory of the good were not in the end advances on the hedonistic utilitarianism set out by Sidgwick. But if struggles with Singer's earlier selves run throughout the book, they are intertwined with struggles to come to terms with the work of Derek Parfit, both Reasons and Persons (Oxford, 1984) and On What Matters (Oxford, 2011), works that have virtually defined the field of analytical rehabilitations of Sidgwick's arguments. The real task of The Point of View of the Universe -- the title being an expression that Sidgwick used to refer to the impartial moral point of view -- is to defend the effort to be even more Sidgwickian than Parfit, and, intriguingly enough, even more Sidgwickian than Sidgwick himself.

To explain, Parfit's On What Matters is a magnificent effort to defend a non-reductive and non-naturalistic, but non-metaphysical and non-ontological form of cognitive intuitionism or rationalism, and to spell out an ethical theory (the Triple Theory) reflecting the convergence of Kantian universalizability, Scanlonian contractualism, and rule consequentialism. Lazari-Radek and Singer largely follow Parfit on the first count, with chapters 2-4 ("Reason and Action," "Intuition and the Morality of Common Sense", and "Justification in Ethics") drawing on both Parfit and Sidgwick to maintain that "there is an alternative to Hume's [and Hare's] view that holds open the possibility of reason playing a more foundational role in human conduct" (65), and that there are genuinely objective normative reasons for action that can also be motivating to some degree. Thus, "Moral motivation begins with the rational judgment that an act is right. This judgment then has its concomitant desires or impulses that provide motivation for doing what is right." (64-65). "Reason," on this interpretation, involves more than "an ability to make valid inferences from premises to conclusions"; it also includes "the ability to recognize and reject capricious or arbitrary grounds for drawing distinctions, and to understand self-evident moral truths -- what Sidgwick referred to as 'rational intuition.'" (182). Much is made of Parfit's famous example of "Future Tuesday Indifference," the evident irrationality of someone who, while normal in other respects, was simply indifferent to future agony if it would be suffered on a future Tuesday, even though it would be full-fledged agony when suffered. A Humean subjectivist about reasons is left powerless in this case, hostage to the present desires of the person with Future Tuesday Indifference. Moreover, to

hold that my future desires give me present reasons would be to import a concept of prudential rationality -- indeed . . . a version of the axiom of prudence that Sidgwick believes to be a self-evident objective principle of reason -- into subjectivism. That would be the kind of account of reasons for action that an objectivist might give and a subjectivist cannot accept. (47)

The authors are more keenly aware than most philosophers that this account of objective normative reasons carries devastating consequences for the prevalent accounts of reason and rationality in the social sciences, particularly neoclassical economics, which remains badly in need of a philosophical makeover on this score, the work of a few cutting-edge figures notwithstanding. On various points, such as the irrationality of pure time discounting, "the philosophers, and the economists who are most influenced by them, get it right." (361). One suspects that a big shock awaits the standard issue economists, rational choice theorists, etc. who pick up this book thinking that a defense of utilitarianism sounds congenial.

But on the second count, Parfit's Triple Theory, de Lazari-Radek and Singer take themselves to be in spirit siding with Sidgwick in seeking a defense of act utilitarianism, a view that gets left behind in Parfit's account of convergence. To be sure, they recognize and acknowledge that Sidgwick himself denied that he had succeeded in defending the utilitarian alternative against the alternative of rational egoism -- this is his so-called "Dualism of the Practical Reason," or philosophical stand-off between rational benevolence and rational egoism. Their most "significant revision" of Sidgwick is their claim (developed throughout the central chapters and coming to a head in chapter 7, "The Origins of Ethics and the Unity of Practical Reason") that "'the Point of View of the Universe' is the perspective of a rational being, in a way that alternative perspectives, such as that of egoism, are not." (378). Still, they plausibly suggest that this is a course that Sidgwick himself would have welcomed to some degree, and agree with him that "cracks in the coherence of ethics caused by the dualism of practical reason are serious, and threaten to bring down the entire structure." (173). Parfit, they claim, is too complacent on this matter and could and should reject the notion of personal and partial reasons -- something that Sidgwick could not see his way to doing, despite his evident sympathy with the idea that we have decisive normative reasons to act in the ways that make things go impartially better.

What is more, two probing chapters on "Ultimate Good" actually come around to the point of stating "In the end, if there is no satisfactory form of desire theory, we find the most plausible alternative is to agree with Sidgwick that the only things that are intrinsically good for a sentient being are desirable states of consciousness, or pleasure." (283). But the objections that they expertly marshal against all forms of desire theory are damning to such a remarkable degree that they seem to leave no road open for finding a "satisfactory form of desire theory," and Sidgwick's hedonism is left looking robust by comparison, Nozick's Experience Machine notwithstanding. "Objective List" theories are also dispatched, in part because hedonism "can be seen as an objective list theory with just one item -- pleasure -- on the list." (213). And against "Happiness Studies," talk of "life satisfaction" is rejected -- rightly -- as a too fickle and inconstant alternative, one that often seems even to be in conflict with happiness as measured by positive emotions (high life satisfaction is for some consistent with surprisingly negative emotions). Importantly, however, talk of happiness is distinguished from talk of pleasure, since happiness is more a matter of positive emotions and a means to pleasure, or "desirable consciousness" as Sidgwick put it, which is the better candidate for ultimate good. Moreover, "hedonism, as Sidgwick understands it, is neither completely internalist nor completely externalist, but intermediate between the two." (238-39).

Throughout these sections the defense of Sidgwick is subtle, tentative and guarded, and Sidgwick is buffed and polished by turning him into an early version of Nobel laureate economist Daniel Kahneman, though Kahneman, as it turns out, still has a few lessons to learn from Sidgwick (desirable consciousness need not require an effort at prolonging it, only an apprehension of its desirability). But three even more brilliantly provocative chapters ("Rules," "Demandingness," and "Distribution") follow, with the authors rejecting not only the whole corrupting crypto-positivist apparatus that continues to pervert much of neoclassical economics, but also the whole corrupting crypto-Kantian apparatus that filters through the alternatives among which Parfit seeks convergence. De Lazari-Radek and Singer challenge everything from the popular publicity criterion for ethical rules (they argue that an esoteric morality might be justifiable) to objections to the demandingness of utilitarianism (they hold that we just do have objective reasons to sacrifice greatly to overcome, e.g., extreme poverty). They allow that Sidgwick himself leaned a bit too heavily on two-level utilitarian indirection and did not go far enough in highlighting how utilitarianism can demand extreme sacrifice, but they plausibly maintain that given better factual assumptions his views do lead to the position Singer has famously defended in works from "Famine, Affluence, and Morality" (Philosophy and Public Affairs 1, 1972) to The Life You Can Save (Random House, 2009). In fact, the defense of esoteric morality comes in handy in defending the argument that

it may well be that advocating too high a standard is less effective in motivating people to give than advocating a lower standard. In that case, a utilitarian ought to advocate the lower standard, and we should praise those who meet this standard, rather than blame them for failing to meet a higher standard. (333)

Of course, praise and blame are, in Sidgwickian fashion, to be doled out in the most utilitarian way.

Like Sidgwick, the authors allow that there is something paradoxical here:

Arguably, we should not even have written this chapter; yet in a book on Sidgwick, to fail to discuss the topic of esoteric morality would be to leave the impression that on this issue Sidgwick's stance -- and therefore utilitarianism in general -- is indefensible. That impression could also have bad consequences. In the end, we have chosen to defend, in this relatively public manner, both utilitarianism and the view that sometimes we are right to do in secret what it would be wrong to do, or to advocate, in public. (316)

Sidgwick's views are also brought into line with Singer's famous Animal Liberation (Harper, 2009 reissue edition), though this is a pretty painless maneuver, given his avowed Benthamism on counting the suffering and happiness of non-human animals. More painful is the recognition that on matters of race and empire, Sidgwick was not given to true and important claims -- quite the contrary. But the authors are to be commended for their simple honesty on such matters, a type of honesty that is all too rare among professional philosophers, who mostly seem to follow Rawls in thinking that in recounting the views of the great exemplars of philosophy, it is fine to politely disregard much of what they actually thought and did, at least when that suggests that their judgments of other human beings were perversely compromised by racism, sexism, classism, etc. Given that academic philosophy remains, to a truly astonishing degree, not only an Old Boys' Network, but an Old Elite White Boys' Network (one suspects that even Sidgwick, who smoked, would have found APA "Smokers" hard to take), that form of misplaced academic politesse really needs to be left behind, along with Sidgwick's suggestion that the expanding circle of concern involves being kinder to "those of our own race more than to black or yellow men." (380). Happily, the authors show, in both theory and practice, how to do just that. They give Sidgwick's insights their due -- noting, too, that he was, like Bentham and Mill, remarkably advanced on issues of gender and sexuality -- without feeling somehow compelled to airbrush out his less insightful (but often just as ethically significant) positions. Such balanced, historically informed judgment is very Sidgwickian, in the best sense.

But the authors manifest less confidence when it comes to the familiar, tangled problems of population ethics. Sidgwick is of course given his due for having recognized how total and average utilitarianism come apart when population is not held constant, but the vast literature that this issue has spawned is hard to tame, especially with Parfit's "Repugnant Conclusion" objection to Sidgwick's total utilitarian approach to optimal population growth, such that this approach could lead to recommending a huge population of people with lives barely worth living, if the total happiness were thus maximized. After canvassing the field, the authors conclude, somewhat meekly, that

Sidgwick's suggestion that we should maximize total utility remains a straightforward and consistent way of handling these questions, even if it has a deeply counter-intuitive consequence. Sidgwick did not consider the repugnant conclusion, so we do not know what he would have said about it. Perhaps he would not have been troubled by counter-intuitive conclusions that have little application to the real world. That is a reasonable position to take, because, as Joshua Greene has suggested, it may simply be too hard for our intuitions to grapple with the numbers involved in the comparison we are being asked to make. Our intuitions don't really respond to the difference between 100 million and 10 billion. (373)

Here it should be noted that on the matter of intuitions, the authors are at pains to distance themselves from loose talk of "considered convictions," etc. As is also clear from the earlier chapters, they would like to junk the famous "method of reflective equilibrium," common to Rawls, Scanlon, and Parfit, but content themselves with suggesting that if it really is what some of its defenders seem to think (allowing for the full critical comparison of even such rivals as Kantian Constructivism and Rational Intuitionism, and a possible defense of moderate foundationalism) then it is rather trivial or otiose, since all the work is done in the hashing out of the rival options (113). There is something of a reluctant concession in this, given Singer's earlier essay on "Sidgwick and Reflective Equilibrium" (The Monist 58/3, 1974), but it is very reluctant, and perhaps only the result of seeing Parfit adopt the language of reflective equilibrium. A profound aversion to anything smacking of Rawlsianism is not one of the stripes that Singer has changed. And given the conspicuous failures of Rawlsianism to translate into anything close to a persuasive account of global justice, one can see his point.

The book is, withal, a spectacular display of philosophical fireworks, breaking from Sidgwick less in its ultimate message than in its unsettling forthrightness, though one can well imagine Sidgwick allowing that in times such as these different tactics are demanded. Commonsense or dogmatic intuitional morality, the third of the three methods of ethics that Sidgwick treats in detail, is here handled more roughly and briefly, with just two elements being treated in some detail: the rule of benevolence and the rule of veracity. Still, the dialectical movement through perceptional intuitionism (updated courtesy of Jonathan Dancy on judging particular acts to be right) and through dogmatic intuitionalism (updated with the help of Bernard Gert, Sissela Bok, and others on commonsense moral rules) to the philosophical intuitionism (or reason fundamentalism) that marks the authors' convergence with both Sidgwick and Parfit really is in line with the structure of the Methods, and both works have some intriguing Hegelian overtones suggesting that this movement is possibly somehow the movement of the world spirit carrying us all along. But in place of Sidgwick's occasional (and always highly qualified) expressions of faith in the direction of civilized thought, the authors would insert the work of Steven Pinker:

The role of reason in leading us to act more ethically is a major theme of Steven Pinker's The Better Angels of our Nature, a study of the factors that have, over the course of human history, reduced violence and cruelty. Pinker assembles an impressive body of evidence to show that, although the 20th century saw two terrible world wars and the atrocities committed by Hitler, Stalin, Pol Pot, and others, anyone born in that century had a lower chance of meeting a violent death at the hands of another human being than people born in any previous century. Pinker regards our ability to reason as one of the key factors in this ethical improvement, which has been taking place over many centuries and even millennia. (379)

Perhaps Sidgwick would find this ground for optimism, if one can imagine him recovering from the shock of the twentieth century. But it seems that even in his day, he hedged his bets, and brought considerable suspicion to bear on sweeping claims about the direction of history, which after all could change tomorrow. Bringing the mass of humanity around to "The Point of View of the Universe" was never an issue he could treat with much optimism, much less sanguinity, which was why he devoted so much of his life to parapsychological research in the hope of finding evidence to support a more rational, theistic form of religion. Oddly enough, Sidgwick could sound a note of cosmic pessimism that might speak even to today's sophisticated nihilists, who have plenty to be nihilistic about. Even if he backed into it from a loss of his childhood Anglicanism, Sidgwick could at least entertain the thought that nothing actually matters, which is why his life and work may be an even richer and more complex philosophical resource than de Lazari-Radek and Singer allow.

Also, it must be admitted that at times Sidgwick seemed to want it all, the best of rational egoism and the best of rational benevolence (or perhaps utilitarianism with a distribution requirement satisfying the demands of egoism). In an earlier edition of the Methods, he observed that there can be "a disinterested aversion to a universe so fundamentally irrational that 'Good for the Individual' is not ultimately identified with 'Universal Good.'" (Methods of Ethics, 2nd edition, 469). Alluding to a poem by Tennyson, he lamented how the "wages of virtue" could be "dust." Curiously, de Lazari-Radek and Singer make few references to earlier editions of the Methods or its evolution.

For all that, their book is full of riches, and there are brilliant critical treatments of a great raft of philosophical positions, from those of W. D. Ross, G. E. M. Anscombe, and R. M. Hare to those of Brad Hooker, David Brink, Simon Blackburn, Richard Arneson, Thomas Hurka, Roger Crisp, Elizabeth Ashford, David Phillips, Rob Shaver, Anthony Skelton, Mariko -Nakano-Okuno, Kwame Anthony Appiah, Wayne Sumner, Sharon Street and on and on. And of course, Rawls, Scanlon, and above all, Parfit.

But it does seem safe to say that of all the arguments and assays, the chief claim they are concerned to make good on is the one about overcoming Sidgwick's Dualism, on their construction of it. After all, this is, in the end, nothing less than the vindication of the utilitarian moral point of view as rational, the only rational option. Could they really have succeeded in this?

There are some questions about how they set up the problem to begin with. The treatment of the distilled core of Sidgwick's "self evident" axioms in chapter 5 ("The Axioms of Ethics") is acute and pivotal; there is much to be said for their simplified account of Sidgwick's axioms as three in number: an Axiom of Justice (what is right for oneself must be right for all who are similarly circumstanced), an Axiom of Prudence (smaller present good should not be preferred to larger future good), and an Axiom of Benevolence (the good of others is just as important as one's own good). Still, it is also true that, as the authors detail, Sidgwick's more careful and refined treatment of these raises many questions about just what the self-evident element is supposed to be -- avoiding mere arbitrary time (but not person) preference does not automatically translate into rational egoism, and rational benevolence appears to need two distinct insights:

the first that from the point of view of the universe, the good of one individual is of no more importance than the good of any other (unless there are special reasons for thinking that more good is likely to be realized [in] one case rather than in the other), and the second that 'as a rational being I am bound to aim at good generally' rather than at just a part of it. (133-34)

There remains some distance, a puzzling distance, between the more exact statements of the axioms and the Dualism as it is usually framed, even by Sidgwick. And, of course, the axioms invoke only "Good," leaving the hedonistic interpretation of it as an additional and perhaps less than self-evident step.

Now, the taming of the interpretation of these axioms, such that the Dualism of the Practical Reason is overcome, takes place with the help of a revised account of the criteria of philosophical intuitionism. For de Lazari-Radek and Singer,

There are thus three elements in the process of establishing that an intuition has the highest possible degree of reliability:

1.     Careful reflection leading to a conviction of self-evidence;

2.     Independent agreement of other careful thinkers; and

3.     The absence of a plausible explanation of the intuition as a non-truth-tracking psychological process.

If the third requirement were not met -- if the intuition could be explained as the outcome of a non-truth-tracking process -- that would not show the intuition to be false, but it would cast some doubt on its reliability. (195)

This too is somewhat revisionary. Sidgwick had argued that apparently self-evident claims had to be clear and precise, able to withstand critical reflection, consistent with one another, and able to win a consensus of experts, though in other writings he collapsed the first two into just one condition. De Lazari-Radek and Singer seem less concerned to reject any element of Sidgwick's account than to add to it, such that the significance of evolutionary "debunking" arguments is recognized. This is, however, a crucial move, the very thing that leads them to reject Sidgwick's Dualism. The key move is evident in this passage:

we might have become reasoning beings because that enabled us to solve a variety of problems that would otherwise have hampered our survival, but once we are capable of reasoning, we may be unable to avoid recognizing and discovering some truths that do not aid our survival. That can be said about some complicated truths of mathematics or physics. It can also, as Parfit has suggested, be the case with some of our normative epistemic beliefs; for instance, the belief that when some argument is valid and has true premises, so that this argument's conclusion must be true, these facts give us a decisive reason to believe this conclusion. Parfit argues that this normative claim about what we have decisive reason to believe is not itself evolutionarily advantageous, since to gain that advantage, it would have been sufficient to have the non-normative beliefs that the argument is valid, and has true premises, and that the conclusion must be true. Hence this and other normative epistemic beliefs are not open to a debunking argument. This may also hold for some of our moral beliefs. One such moral truth could be Sidgwick's axiom of universal benevolence: "each one is morally bound to regard the good of any other individual as much as his own, except in so far as he judges it to be less, when impartially viewed, or less certainly knowable or attainable by him" (ME 382). (182-83)

Thus, if, with Sharon Street, one holds that in many cases "it is more scientifically plausible to explain human evaluative attitudes as having evolved because they help us to survive and to have surviving offspring, than because they are true" (180), one can debunk many of the beliefs competing with the Axiom of Universal Benevolence, such as those purportedly justifying partial or personal reasons for action. If Benevolence is not debunked, and if it can in fact be accounted for straightforwardly as a result of reason coming as a unity or package, such that either

we have a capacity to reason that includes the capacity to do advanced physics and mathematics and to grasp objective moral truths, or we have a much more limited capacity to reason that lacks not only these abilities, but others that confer an overriding evolutionary advantage. If reason is a unity of this kind, having the package would have been more conducive to survival and reproduction than not having it. (183).

Street, for her part, "does not directly confront the idea that the capacity to grasp moral truths is simply an application of our capacity to reason, which enables us to grasp a priori truths in general, including both the truths of mathematics and moral truths." (185).

This way of overcoming Sidgwick's Dualism is certainly ingenious and sophisticated, turning what has so often been the Darwinian critique of normative ethics into a vindication of it. But as the authors allow, it is somewhat hostage to the fortunes of evolutionary psychology:

We acknowledge that there are grounds for questioning whether our ability to reason is likely to have evolved as a package, rather than in the more piecemeal fashion in which evolution tends to proceed, resulting in the evolution of distinct modes of reasoning, which would not have included the capacity to grasp moral truths, if that were disadvantageous in evolutionary terms. The fact that mathematical reasoning takes place in a different part of the brain from deductive reasoning (and so may have had a separate evolutionary origin) would also lead one to expect moral reasoning to be at least as distinct. It is possible that further research will eventually clarify this question, and if it can be shown that there is no 'package' of the kind we have postulated, that would undermine the argument we are making here. (183-84)

My guess is that the authors will concede that this is a somewhat more mitigated solution to the crisis of ethics than finding firm evidence of an afterlife serving the cause of Cosmic justice, which is the space where Sidgwick's optimism could take him when he was not busy being more soberly pessimistic. But one can only hope that their option will prove inspiring enough to help turn humanity around, to help nudge it onto a course less likely to demonstrate that the advance of reason turned out to be of no evolutionary advantage to people at all. Their effort certainly calls for praise.


I am most grateful to Katarzyna de Lazari-Radek and Peter Singer for their very helpful feedback on a draft of this review.