The Self and Self-Knowledge

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Annalisa Coliva (ed.), The Self and Self-Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2012, 320pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199590650.

Reviewed by Aaron Zimmerman, University of California, Santa Barbara


This is a stimulating collection of essays on the nature of people and the various ways in which we represent ourselves. I primarily recommend it to epistemologists concerned with distinguishing ignorance of oneself (and unwarranted or accidentally accurate self-representation) from genuine self-knowledge. The nature of self-knowledge -- and the authority we typically grant a person's account of her beliefs and actions -- are the twin themes of eight of the volume's twelve essays. There are also several contributions of interest to philosophers of mind, as roughly half of the authors advance hypotheses about the cognitive mechanisms involved in perception, action and introspection; and a little something for metaphysicians: two essays address classical puzzles about the nature of people and their persistence over time.

The volume is divided into three sections: (1) The Self and Its Individuation, (2) Consciousness, Action Awareness, and Their Role in Self-Knowledge, and (3) Self-Knowledge: Robust or Fragile?.  Part 3 consists of four essays focused squarely on the nature of self-knowledge. Part 2 is a mini-festschrift to Christopher Peacocke. Two of its chapters are critical discussions of Peacocke's views, one is a defense of Peacocke from a criticism published elsewhere, and the final chapter is Peacocke's reply to the two criticisms published here. Peacocke also contributes a substantive essay to the volume's Part 1, which is otherwise a sort of grab bag: one essay on the persistence of the self through time, one on the role that knowledge of mental causation plays in self-representation, and one on the intuition that people transcend nature.

Peacocke's main contribution (chapter 3) begins at the beginning -- with an examination of the most rudimentary ways in which animals represent themselves -- by asking us to imagine a sea creature floating from one location to another while regulating its internal temperature in response to the temperature of its surroundings. Mightn't the creature remember its having been hotter there then than it is here now without representing itself as having been hotter then than it is now? Peacocke thinks so and dubs the phenomenon self-representation of Degree 0 (86-87). In contrast, Degree 1 self-representation only occurs when an organism represents "itself as itself" in some way or other, though Peacocke allows that some relatively simple creatures -- he doesn't say which -- endowed with sight, "action awareness" or memory can accomplish this feat without the aid of introspection traditionally conceived. When an organism sees something coming towards itself, or has a direct awareness of its fleeing the approaching object, or remembers its having dodged something similar in the past, the creature succeeds in representing itself as itself (74-75). Indeed, Peacocke allows that animals can have perceptions and memories and an immediate awareness of their actions without being "sensitive to reasons." And since, Peacocke asserts, sensitivity to reasons is necessary for the possession of concepts, Peacocke concludes that relatively simple animals represent themselves in a non-conceptual manner.

According to Peacocke's taxonomy, distinctively conceptual representation of oneself is Degree 2 self-representation (88). Human children exploit the non-conceptual sense of themselves they enjoy by perceiving, acting with awareness, and remembering things to grasp the concept their care givers canonically associate with "I" and they therein gain the ability to describe their actions ("I'm walking") and self-attribute mental states with genuine understanding ("I want milk"). The concept the child then grasps is "unstructured" or simple: it is not, for example, equivalent to the concept a person might associate with "the performer of this action" or "the thinker of this thought" (75-76). Instead, the child uses the "I" concept to think of herself in a direct (non-descriptive) manner, and it is part of the "nature" of the kind of thought she uses this concept to formulate that its truth (indeed its truth relative to any context of evaluation and any possible world) depends entirely on how things are with her. He dubs the target phenomenon "subject reflexivity."

There is some tension between Peacocke's view on these matters and John Campbell's account of the minimal conditions of conceptual self-awareness in chapter 4. According to Campbell, a person must have some idea of her psychological states "causally impacting" one another if she is to refer to herself (103). When someone thinks to herself "I am F," she assumes that she is using "I" to refer to the person whose mental states are causing the relevant tokening of "I." Campbell thinks the dependence of first person thought on knowledge of the causes of one's mental life is evidenced by cases of thought insertion in which it seems to a subject as if someone else is causing the thought "I am F" to occur in her mind. "It is only because we grasp the causal structure of the self that we can be said to think of the self as an object" (103).

By Campbell's lights, the concept of causation a person must utilize to gain an understanding of the first person will be an "interventionist" one on which c's causally influencing e consists in the fact that a certain kind of intervention on c is consistently followed with an alteration in e. The question then is how I can verify that an intervention of the appropriate kind will yield a change in my mind. Campbell says I cannot just do this at will. The external world must play a part. I must verify that changes in the immediate environment yield corresponding changes in my perceptual beliefs. But what of choice, intention and volition? When I exert some effort in keeping my hands raised and I see (or feel) that my hands thereby remain aloft, don't I get a similar sense of my place in the causal nexus? Campbell doesn't discuss this side of the coin. And his account of first person thought would seem to put the cart before the horse. Don't I already need some sense of myself if I am to gain knowledge of my perceptual beliefs (as such)?

In the second half of his chapter, Peacocke takes aim at Hume's claim that the mind's contents are "distinct existences" (89-99). It is common sense that sensations and experiences, thoughts and beliefs, desires and intentions must all have bearers to exist. The idea of a pain that is not someone's pain or a belief that is not someone's belief is incoherent. But Peacocke's more controversial claim is that subjects must (by their very "natures") be capable of phenomenal consciousness: to be a subject, there must be "something it is like" to be you. Consider Peacocke's simple sea creature. It's supposed to be a subject, so there must be something it is like to be it. But is there? It's hard to imagine an animal that really remembers and perceives things without therein enjoying conscious experience. But if we describe Peacocke's creature as floating around "registering" changes in temperature, we needn't assume that it enjoys conscious experience. Must we then conclude that our sea creature isn't even a subject? There are those, like Carol Rovane, in chapter 1, who insist that couples, teams and corporations can be agents (29-31). Clearly these composite units do not themselves enjoy experiences of any kind. Does Peacocke reject Rovane's proposal out of hand, or mightn't there be more than one sense of "subject" (or "agent") in play?

Peacocke's theory of personal identity is a physicalist one on which we each continue to exist so long as the "material integrating apparatus" that "realizes" the unity of our experiences over time persists (97-98). Rovane acknowledges that physicalist views of this kind are defensible, but she argues that psychological accounts -- on which persistence consists in the (non-branching) continuity and connectedness of a set of mental states (rather than the apparatus that realizes them) -- are equally coherent. Critics of the psychological approach have long argued that our common conception of memories and intentions incorporates an assumption of a person's persistence. (To say that you remember something is to say that you correctly represent your doing it; to say that you intend to do something is to say that you are committed to your doing it when the time is appropriate.) An account that "analyzes" persistence in terms of memory and intention is therefore objectionably circular. Sydney Shoemaker (1970) introduced the notion of "quasi-memory" in response to these concerns. By carefully explicating Derek Parfit's (1971) famous fission cases, Rovane does a marvelous job of describing how an agent might experience quasi-memories and formulate quasi-intentions.

For those who don't know the story: we are to suppose that Parfit's mind is fully realized in his brain's left hemisphere and redundantly realized in his right, and that these two hemispheres are then successfully implanted in two different bodies. The two resulting agents (Lefty and Righty) would have quasi-memories of Parfit's actions; prior to surgery Parfit might form differing quasi-intentions for Lefty and Righty to execute; and both Lefty and Righty might experience quasi-memories of these directives. And yet, in one of the volume's highlights, Rovane mounts a compelling argument against the coherence of a comparable notion of quasi-reasoning. Lefty can have quasi-memories of what Parfit did before the surgery, but insofar as he uses what Parfit knew to guide his reasoning and deliberation, Lefty must represent these propositions as things he (Lefty) also knows (26-29). Rovane claims that this marks an important distinction between rationality and phenomenology.

Rovane argues that neither a psychological nor a physicalist account of our persistence through time fully meshes with our intuitions. Once we recognize that the metaphysics of personal identity is underdetermined by objective constraints, Rovane thinks we should feel free to adopt self-consciously revisionary conceptions of persons. She offers her argument for multiple and group persons (29-31) in this light. Corporate bodies will be agents if we choose to think of them in this way (given the coherence of this conception). And we will count as thinking of them in this way so long as we hold them to the norms to which we subject more traditional examples of people. The idea is intriguing, and there clearly is some room for choice in how we think of persons, agents and the like. But do we have the freedom we would need to embrace Rovane's rather radical revision? And are there good pragmatic reasons for doing so?

In chapter 2, Martine Nida-Rümelin rounds out the first of the volume's three sections by arguing that counterfactual claims about ourselves differ in kind from counterfactual claims about material things. Consider a particular table, the wood planks from which it is made, and the artisan who constructed it. Once you describe a possible world in which: (a) the planks in question do not exist, (b) the artisan either does not exist or hasn't created anything, and (c) there is no table that resembles the particular table under question, you have "ruled out" the existence of this table. But now suppose that you describe a world in which (a') the molecules that now constitute my body do not exist, (b') my parents either do not exist or didn't reproduce, and (c') there is no person that resembles me. According to Nida-Rümelin there is a sense in which you haven't yet ruled out my existence at this world. It may be impossible for me to exist in a world that satisfies (a')-(c'), but the idea is not incoherent, and this marks a distinction in kind between our thinking about subjects and objects.

In chapter 6, Connor McHugh employs the notion of an implicit "sensitivity to reasons" to defend Peacocke's account of self-knowledge from an objection McHugh attributes to Annalisa Coliva (2008). According to Peacocke, a subject's conscious judgment that p has phenomenological properties in virtue of which it is directly accessible to that subject. A judgment raised to consciousness in this way provides a subject with a "good reason" to believe that she believes that p because a judgment that p "initiates or manifests" the belief that p and so is "constitutively" connected to the truth of the introspective belief grounded in it. Coliva wonders whether this account of self-knowledge is too externalist. Even if the fact that you have judged that p is directly accessible to you and provides you with a reliable basis on which to believe that you believe that p, mightn't the judgment fail to justify the relevant introspective belief or render it rational? According to McHugh, something like this can happen when a subject has the phenomenological characteristic of judging that p when she really only hopes that p. A rational agent will avoid falsely concluding that she believes that p in such a case because she knows that "she wants p to be true so much that she is liable to engage in wishful thinking" or she is "aware that the evidence in favour of the truth of p is far weaker than she would usually take to be conclusive" or "she is aware that she is not committed to the truth of p" (158, cf. 148). But is this true? Surely a believer can know that she hopes Jesus really was resurrected, and know that her evidence for the resurrection is "far weaker than she would usually take to be conclusive" on matters of this kind, without this rendering her judgment that she believes in the resurrection unjustified or unwarranted. Whether she is justified in believing in the resurrection is of course a separate matter. But an atheist can accuse a believer of epistemic irrationality without therein accusing her of insincerity.

In chapter 5, Jane Heal further examines Peacocke's claim that a subject's conscious judgments, experiences and emotions "directly" justify her introspective belief in their existence. A person can be fearful or jealous of someone, reflect to the best of her ability, and yet fail to recognize her emotion as fear or jealously. She may interpret her experience as discomfort with the target of her fear rather than fear of him, or insist that she is experiencing (warranted) disapproval of her rival's character rather than jealousy of his accomplishments (130-131). Indeed, Heal rightly points out that interpretation or conceptualization also plays a role in the formation of our more basic introspective judgments. Consider a case of Gareth Evans' (1982) in which a subject sees ten lights before him but miscounts and judges there to be eleven lights there instead. Such a subject will think it looks to him as though there are eleven lights before him when it really looks to him as though there are ten lights there. As Heal points out, even if knowledge of our minds is non-inferential and non-observational, epistemic or cognitive skill might still play an essential role in its acquisition.

In chapter 7, Lucy O'Brien takes aim at Peacocke's account of our immediate awareness of our own actions. On Peacocke's account, we have a "basic" way of being aware of what we are doing that is distinct from our conceptual knowledge of our actions. The awareness in question is non-perceptual; it is independent of any sensory perception of the action of which it is an awareness; and it can occur as a merely "apparent" awareness, as when it seems to you that you are raising your hand, when you are not (169). Peacocke adopts a model of this phenomenon on which trying to do something direct causes the apparent awareness of the action one is trying to perform. But O'Brien argues that this account comes to grief with regard to basic actions that are not initiated by "tryings." Citing work by Brian O'Shaughnessy (2009), O'Brien argues that a person can talk to herself without trying to talk to herself, as there is no prospect of her trying and failing to perform a mental act of this type.

Peacocke responds to Heal and O'Brien in chapter 8. His reply to O'Brien is two-pronged. First he denies that one can act without trying. A severely depressed person can try to talk to herself but find herself with nothing to say. But even if there are basic actions that do not themselves incorporate tryings, Peacocke insists that his account can be easily modified to correctly model our immediate awareness of them. Insofar as we are directly aware of actions we perform without trying, these actions will have some "initiating event" that plays the role Peacocke's current model assigns to tryings. In reply to Heal, Peacocke somewhat flat-footedly denies the phenomenon to which she points. He notes that fearing someone is not the same thing as being anxious in that person's presence. To fear someone, Peacocke argues, one must represent that person as dangerous and (in this way or some other) experience one's anxiety as fear (181). The point is well taken, and Heal is perhaps guilty of under-describing the case on offer. But it's hard to see how the existence of the cases to which she points can be reasonably denied.

Puzzles remain. According to the standard functionalist metaphysics, to believe that p, an agent's actions and inferences must be suitably guided or influenced by p. But how can I know in a direct manner whether I would act or reason on the information that p were it relevant to the task at hand? And if I cannot have immediate knowledge of my cognitive and behavioral dispositions, how can I have immediate knowledge of beliefs constituted by these dispositions? The four essays that comprise the volume's final section address questions in this vein. In chapter 12, Akeel Bilgrami begins his answer with an argument for the ambiguity of "belief." When "belief" is used to refer to a person's (first order) cognitive and behavioral dispositions, it picks out something over which she lacks first person authority. Her views on her beliefs so understood do not carry a presumption of truth. But we also use "belief" to refer to a person's commitments. And a person's judgment or assertion that she is committed to the truth of a given proposition is justly granted authority.

Coliva (chapter 10) offers a similar account. We are authoritative about our commitments construed as speech acts or dispositions to such. Psychological concepts are acquired through "blind drill" with psychological terms. Children are taught to say, "I believe that p" as an alternative to saying "P" and they eventually pick up the habit. There is no epistemic gap between asserting that p (believing that p) and asserting that one believes that p (believing that one believes that p) because both of these phenomena can be equated with the commitment to use p in inference and defend p with arguments. She describes the account as "constructivist." In asserting that I believe that p I bring it about that I believe that p by shouldering the commitments with which believing that p is best identified.

Bilgrami argues that the commitments in question are not just "normative" in that they are subject to criticism and evaluation -- they are "themselves normative states" (272). But what is this supposed to mean? At first, Bilgrami says that a subject's believing that p cannot be equated with her having dispositions of any kind, but he soon retreats to the more modest claim that believing that p cannot be equated with the possession of a set of first order dispositions (272, n6). To believe that men are no smarter than women is to commit oneself to employing this information in one's reasoning, deliberation and action. On Bilgrami's account, one's commitment to this truth is not put into doubt by one's misogynistic comments, inferences, hiring practices and the like, so long as one tries to do better when these behaviors are brought to one's attention. But the disposition to take the relevant criticism to heart and alter one's reasoning and behavior in its light is still a disposition. So, while Bilgrami is right to reject crudely behavioristic accounts of belief that equate its possession with dispositions that can be specified without the use of psychological concepts, most functionalists join him in this stance. And most functionalists do not think of themselves as rejecting naturalism, or as pursuing an approach to psychological explanation that is discontinuous with the methodologies now prevalent in psychology departments. Bilgrami must do more to show that philosophers must abandon a naturalistic approach to the mind if they are to admit the existence of commitments construed as dispositions to revise one's reasoning and behavior in response to incongruities between them and one's assertions.

In Chapter 9, Dorit Bar-On further develops an "expressivist" approach to self-knowledge that resembles the Coliva-Bilgrami line in its emphasis on speech acts and rhetorical dispositions. But she situates the view in relation to "content externalism" and its seeming incompatibility with a distinctively introspective route to knowledge of one's own mind. According to the content externalist, the contents of our thoughts are in part determined by factors external to our minds or brains. (If he is embedded in a sufficiently different environment, my duplicate might not share my beliefs.) Surely, introspection can only generate awareness of states, events and acts that are "internal" to a subject's mind or brain. So must content externalists then deny that we have introspective access to our own minds? Bar-On argues that we can see our way to reconciling externalism with first person authority by rejecting a "recognitional" conception of self-knowledge according to which the knowledge that I am thinking that (e.g.) water is potable depends on discriminating this thought from the "counterfeit" thought my differently located duplicate would also express as "water is potable." This is especially so if discriminating these thoughts is supposed to depend on identifying some feature possessed by only one member of the pair. Instead, in judging that I am thinking that water is potable, I therein think that water is potable. The judgment is self-verifying.

Of course, few of our introspective judgments are self-verifying. But Bar-On points out that "avowals" have a similar property. Though the judgment that, e.g., I hope there is water over the hill does not verify itself, in the normal case, when I utter, "I hope there is water over the hill" I both express the hope in question and assert that I have that hope. The expressed hope renders true my claim that I have it. Avowals of this kind are not, however, infallible, as circumstances can conspire to "press" an avower into error. Bar-On gives the example of someone yelping out of an (as yet unrealized) expectation of something painful happening to her (207).

Paul Snowdon's examination in chapter 11 of Crispin Wright's (1998) treatment of avowals offers a nice counterpoint to these reflections on the puzzle of self-knowledge. Snowdon takes Wright to task for focusing on speech acts like self-ascription and avowal and the norms that govern them. In response to Wright, Snowdon describes a number of cases in which we are agnostic, doubtful or just plain wrong about what we are thinking and feeling. Suppose, for example, that a doctor pushes his patient's abdomen in two different locations -- A and B -- and asks which hurts more. When the patient says A, the doctor informs him that he has the more serious of two candidate conditions and that drastic surgery is required. Would the patient insist on the incorrigibility of his introspective judgment or ask for another probe? Snowdon draws the same moral as Heal. Introspective knowledge is often substantial. The conditions of its attainment can only be articulated by those cognizant of our introspective failures.

Of course, this is not to deny the value of an investigation into avowals, commitments and the semantic (and moral) norms that govern their performance and retraction. But there is a rich underlying psychology to investigate as well -- an investigation to which the authors featured in this volume have already contributed a great deal.


Coliva, A. "Peacocke's Self-Knowledge," Ratio (New Series) 21, pp. 13-27.

Evans, G., The Varieties of Reference, J. McDowell (ed), Oxford: Clarendon (1982).

O'Shaughnessy, B., "Trying and Acting," in L. O'Brien and M. Soteriou (eds), Mental

Actions, Oxford UP (2009), pp. 163-72.

Parfit, D., "Personal Identity," The Philosophical Review, 80 (1971), pp. 3-27.

Shoemaker, S., "Persons and the Pasts," American Philosophical Quarterly, 7 (1970), pp. 269-85.

Wright, C. "Self-Knowledge: the Wittgensteinian Legacy," in C. Wright, B. Smith and C. McDonald (eds), Knowing Our Own Minds, Oxford: Clarendon (1998), pp. 13-45.