The Unity of Content and Form in Philosophical Writing: The Perils of Conformity

Placeholder book cover

Jon Stewart, The Unity of Content and Form in Philosophical Writing: The Perils of Conformity, Bloomsbury, 2013, 217pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472512765.

Reviewed by Keith Allen, University of York


Jon Stewart’s book is a fascinating and thought-provoking study of the relationship between the content of philosophical works and the form in which they are expressed. Stewart argues that the homogeneity of the currently received forms of philosophical expression -- the journal article and its extended form, the monograph -- stands in stark contrast with the diverse forms of expression that philosophical writing has taken throughout its history. Moreover, Stewart argues that the current homogeneity of expression is damaging to philosophy as a discipline: not only are certain philosophical claims and arguments well suited to particular forms of expression, but by privileging one form of expression to the exclusion of others we are in danger of losing touch with our philosophical predecessors whose means of expression differed from our own.

Stewart examines the plurality of forms philosophical expression has taken through a series of case studies. One chapter considers Seneca’s use of the literary devices of paradox and oxymoron (‘Rest is sometimes far from restful’, ‘To win true freedom you must be a slave to philosophy’) to present Stoic doctrine to a Roman audience whose values were diametrically opposed to those of Stoicism. Stewart argues that the use of paradox and oxymoron enabled Seneca to draw attention to special or novel ways of using terms familiar to his audience, without the need to coin technical terms that would hinder what he took to be the important practical function of philosophy.

Stewart’s examples are mainly concerned, however, with differences in literary genre. Two chapters consider the use of dialogue as a means of philosophical expression. The first concerns Plato’s use of dialogue, both as a way of distinguishing Socrates from the Sophists, who charged to impart philosophical wisdom and so whose philosophical interactions typically took the form of lengthy orations, and as a way of illustrating key aspects of the content of Socrates’s philosophy, including his famous claim in the Meno that innate knowledge is a form of recollection. A second chapter on dialogue form considers Hume’s use of dialogue, briefly in The Enquiries and more extensively in Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, as a way of camouflaging Hume’s controversial views on religion.

The use of literary genre to present radical philosophical views is a theme that Stewart returns to in considering the use of drama by Lessing and Sartre. Lessing was banned from publishing on religious matters without prior approval from the censors after editing, publishing, and defending the ‘Wolfenbüttel fragments’, sections of a work by biblical scholar Reimarus that challenged key claims in the Bible. Stewart argues that changing genres to drama in Nathan the Wise enabled Lessing to continue to explore a number of ideas about the nature of Christianity expressed in his earlier polemical work. In Sartre’s case, Sartre used the plays Bariona and The Flies to present the theory of freedom he developed in a more conventional genre in Being and Nothingness. Bariona was written and performed in a prisoner-of-war camp, and The Flies was written and staged during the German Occupation. Although both deal ostensibly with classical subjects, the works aimed to foster a feeling of solidarity and resistance amongst French audiences, who were able to see in them hidden messages regarding their situation. Stewart argues that by presenting his views in the form of drama, rather than a philosophical treatise, Sartre’s message ‘was most effectively stated in the given historical situation’ (p. 157).

Elsewhere, Stewart argues that the form philosophical writing takes can be still more closely connected to its content. For instance, he argues that Erasmus’s use of satire in Praise of Folly enables Erasmus to effectively criticise both the content and form of Scholastic philosophy. Whereas Erasmus views Christianity as an essentially anti-intellectual religion, Scholastic discussions of theological matters, which take the form of quaestiones with a plethora of neologisms and fine distinctions, treat Christianity as a fundamentally intellectual religion. Given the content of his criticisms of scholasticism, Stewart reasons that Erasmus could not himself have expressed them in the received style, since to do so ‘would have compromised the content of his theology, and it would have begged the question in favor of his opponents’ (p. 49).

Stewart argues that there is a similarly tight connection between form and content in Kierkegaard’s innovative, but often confusing, use of genre. He argues that Kierkegaard’s use of genre was essential to his criticism of German Idealism, works of which themselves often display a strong connection between form and content, with the systematic organisation of the work walking in step with a thesis about the systematic nature of mind and world. According to Stewart, Kierkegaard didn’t simply write in a confused, disorganized way, but the very form of his writing mirrored his objections to systematic German thought. Kierkegaard disagreed with Hegel that religion is just another form of knowing to be deduced from general principles, and that in general ‘truth is one’. Rather, he believed that there are incommensurable ‘objective’ and ‘subjective’ truths, such that subjective truths are personal and private and so can’t be presented by means of systematic philosophical treatise (p. 88). Kierkegaard therefore needed to devise an alternative form of writing that was better suited to the content of his philosophy, and through his use of purposefully unsystematic writings aimed ‘to appropriate the Christian message in the life of the individual’ (p. 93).

Furthest from the traditional philosophical canon, three chapters of the book consider Jorge Luis Borges’s use of short stories as arguments by reductio ad absurdum against philosophical theses: nominalist theories of language in ‘Funes the Memorious’, Berkelian idealism in ‘Tlön, Uqbar, Orbis Tertius’, the commensurability of conceptual schemes in ‘Averroës’ Search’, and traditional conceptions of immortality in ‘The Immortal’. In each case, Stewart argues that Borges uses short stories to imagine fictional worlds in which certain philosophical claims are true, and thinks through the consequences to derive a contradiction. In ‘Funes the Memorious’, for instance, Borges uses the story of Ireneo Funes, who has a remarkable memory for details of particular matters of fact, to argue against the possibility of a purely nominalist language that contains no abstract general terms, and to establish instead the dialectical nature of human cognition as involving both the particular and general. In the story, Funes eventually dies of ‘congestion of the lungs’, a metaphor for ‘an overload of sensible particulars which his mind could not order or organize’ (p. 108), which Borges uses to illustrate the implausibility of the nominalist model of language.

Stewart’s fascinating reflections on philosophical writing and the forms it can take raise a number of important and pressing questions; here I will focus on just two. The first concerns the extent of the homogeneity of current philosophical expression. On the one hand, there is perhaps more diversity in professional philosophical writing than Stewart acknowledges. The claim that journal articles and monographs exert a stranglehold over philosophical expression, for instance, overlooks the increasing use of new media, such as email, blogs, podcasts, and even twitter to engage in philosophical dialogue. And the claim that journal articles and monographs themselves constitute a homogenous form of expression overlooks differences between (sub-)genres of academic writing. These differences include, for instance: those between short Analysis-style articles and ‘big picture’ pieces published in journals like Mind or The Philosophical Review; differences between monographs that collect together previously published journal articles and those with cohesive narratives that resemble more closely monographs published elsewhere in the humanities; and differences in style between history of philosophy, philosophy ‘done historically’, and ahistorical approaches to philosophical issues. On the other hand, Stewart’s selection of case studies to illustrate the diversity of forms that philosophical writing can take raises interesting questions about when it is appropriate to describe a work as a work of philosophy. This is particularly true in the case of Borges, who was not himself a professional philosopher; however as Stewart notes, similar questions arise in relation to Lessing (p. 80) and even Kierkegaard (p. 81). The problem is that applying the term ‘philosophical’ too widely threatens to undermine Stewart’s homogeneity thesis: if Borges’s short stories count as works of philosophy, then why not novels by Murdoch, Pirsig, or Rand, or films by Christopher Nolan? And if they do, then perhaps diversity of philosophical expression is in general alive and well.

A second question concerns the precise nature of the connection between the form and content of philosophical writing. Stewart’s case studies appear to point in importantly different directions. Some of the examples he considers, such as Borges’s short stories, show that certain philosophical claims and arguments can be expressed by means other than a journal article or monograph. But this falls short of establishing anything like a unity of form and content, as the title of Stewart’s book promises.

At times Stewart seems to be arguing for a very strong connection between form and content: that certain philosophical claims, theses, or arguments strictly demand certain forms of expression, and cannot adequately be expressed any other way. This, for instance, appears to be the moral of the discussion of Erasmus’s use of satire to criticise Scholastic theology. As Stewart puts it, ‘Certain deep truths, indeed philosophical truths, can only be expressed with laughter and not with grave philosophical ratiocination’ (p. 52). (Compare Stewart’s conclusion to his discussion of Kierkegaard: ‘He was passionately engaged with and made significant contributions to the philosophical issues of the day, but the only way he could be true to his principles was to do it in a rigorously nonphilosophical way’, (p. 95).)

This very strong form-content unity thesis, however, is questionable. In general, philosophy appears to differ from, say, poetry -- where form and content may seem to be very closely related -- to the extent that philosophical claims lend themselves to re-expression in different ways. As Stewart himself notes, Erasmus made many of the same criticisms of Scholastic philosophy in a more conventional form in Enchiridion Militis Christiani. Indeed, the form of The Unity of Content and Form in Philosophical Writing itself threatens to undermine a very strong form-content unity thesis. Given its content -- that the homogeneity of current philosophical expression is damaging to the discipline -- one of the most striking features of Stewart's book is that its form is remarkably conventional. It is written in crisp, lucid prose, of a kind that ‘analytic’ philosophers like Ayer and Carnap (two of the villains of the piece) would be proud; the book is divided into eleven roughly equal length chapters, each of which is further divided into sub-sections and concludes with a brief summary of what has been established; and like the philosophical monographs whose ubiquity Stewart laments (p. 5), this book itself draws on and extends previously published journal articles (p. vii).

For the most part, Stewart appears to be arguing for the weaker (and more plausible) claim that particular forms of expression are merely more or less appropriate depending on their intended audience or the wider context: for instance, that Seneca’s use of oxymoron and paradox was particularly appropriate given the views of his Roman audience, or that Hume’s use of dialogue was an effective means of obscuring his own personal religious views from a deeply religious audience. On this weaker understanding of the link between form and content, the form of Stewart’s own criticisms of current philosophical expression do not vitiate their content: since his audience are primarily professional philosophers, then the most effective way of expressing these criticisms will be in the received form. As such, Stewart’s book provides much needed reflection on the nature of philosophical writing that raises important and pressing questions about the nature and practices of the discipline.