Head Cases: Julia Kristeva on Philosophy and Art in Depressed Times

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Elaine P. Miller, Head Cases: Julia Kristeva on Philosophy and Art in Depressed Times, Columbia University Press, 2014, 245pp, $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231166829.

Reviewed by Sara Beardsworth, Southern Illinois University Carbondale


Scholarly monographs on Kristeva that seek today to illuminate her writings as a whole must find a path that both follows and unifies the myriad, ongoing intellectual journeys Kristeva has taken over nearly half a century. Elaine Miller achieves this in a distinctive way by using the device of couples to relate Kristeva to modern aesthetics and theories of the imagination from Kant to Melanie Klein. Although Hegel appears repeatedly, Kristeva's ideas are largely counterposed to his idealist aesthetics. Thinkers and writers in aesthetic theory and literature after Hegel form the couples productive of an understanding of Kristeva's thought on art and literature: Kristeva with Benjamin, with Adorno, with Kafka, with Proust. Miller draws upon an ever-widening field of aesthetic ideas to show how Kristeva transforms modern aesthetics in her way of writing on art and literature. What unifies this field is the stamp of the melancholia of the modern age. A notion of melancholia underlies or is active in all the moments of philosophical and literary aesthetics that Miller covers. This allows the discussions of allegory (Kristeva with Benjamin), mimesis (with Adorno), irony (with Hegel on Diderot), the image as a kind of natality (with Arendt), sublimation (with Proust), and tragedy (with Hegel, Freud, and Klein) to present a series of couples.

Miller's first chapter is mainly devoted to the task of articulating the problem of melancholic modernity, which is variously diagnosed as the result of a technological universe of the image, the fragmenting tendency of modern life, and the loss of bonds with symbolic life. The last represents Kristeva's steadfast attention to developments in her own time. Her use of Guy Debord's notion of the society of the spectacle is a point of focus for her special emphasis on the impasses and possibilities of the image in modernity. At the same time, Miller shows that this emphasis falls in line with Kristeva's view that men and women today tend to dispense with the representation of experience that we call psychic life. This approach illuminates well the movement in her between psychoanalysis, art, and literature, which is a constant in her writings. It becomes clear that what interests Kristeva in aesthetics and psychoanalysis is not simply theoretical or historical accounts of works of art and literature or of the Freudian psyche. Rather, the central question for her is the destinies of representation in view of a tendency to a depreciation of the imaginary realm in modernity, including the psychical ability to "register impressions and their meaningful values for the subject" (23, 31). Thus psychoanalysis appears less as a specialized theoretical field than a journey in psychoanalytic experience, where possibilities of recovery from the maladies it can approach have the status of creativity more than normalcy, not unlike, yet in a different way than, modern works of art and literature. Melancholia and depression have a central place in Kristeva's thought as a cultural and not merely individual affliction because they are a point of tension between the failings and what is failed: the depreciation of the imaginary realm and the chances it opens up for subjective and cultural renewal.

The notion of depression that appears in Miller's title therefore has three dimensions. It is a "new malady of the soul" (1), acknowledging that severe depression is a marked characteristic of modern cultures. It is a kind of working through in psychoanalysis, and so a passage as well as an affliction. In the psychoanalytic viewpoint depression is a marker of human individuation. The entrance into symbolic life comes at the price of a psychic death in getting free of the mother, a severance that, under certain conditions, opens up psychic space, the space for representation. Finally, modern art and literature are a creative response of melancholic modernity, which moves beyond the depression without the "overly successful mourning" attributed to Hegel's idealism (17). In sum, because depression is an important symptom, registering a diminishing of the imaginary realm and manifesting the disorder of our time, Kristeva and others attentive to the possibilities of the aesthetic share an interest in not overcoming it.

Kristeva herself emphasizes imaginary forms that express rather than suppress the more unstable grounds of creativity. The lost head is a primary image of severance in the psychoanalytic perspective. Decapitation is a condition of creativity in Colette and is aligned with imagistic art. All of this illuminates the title that Miller chose for her book. Together, the lost head and the image of the provisional, tenuously attached head figure the life and art that make "a bridge back from depression" (14). Miller calls this "forging a head." The title was clearly inspired by Kristeva's curation of an exhibition at the Louvre in 1998 on the art and rituals of decapitation, and its accompanying text, translated into English as The Severed Head: Capital Visions. Kristeva's text finds the art of decapitation confronting the human face of death and murder, and proposes that representation may be the only possible resurrection in relation to the cruelty of the stories behind many of the artefacts and artworks, from skull worship to paintings of Judith and Holofernes, David and Goliath, John the Baptist, and the head of Louis VXI. Miller sounds a more personal note at the outset of and conclusion to her book. She allows the psychoanalytic emphasis on the need of depressive working through to emerge in the poignant humor of spooky stories told at sleepovers and around campfires, or in therapies that allow adolescents and adults to engage in the full register of feeling and meaning, including unexpected affects and jarring figures and images, like the severed head. To Miller, Kristeva's responses to melancholic modernity have shown how important it is for individuals to be able to take up a relationship to human damage, vulnerability, and finitude.

However, it is Kristeva's relation to modern aesthetics that is Miller's central focus. Not all will agree with Miller's reading of Hegel's idealism as overly successful mourning that surpasses the difficulties of modernity. Although her contrasting logics of mourning and melancholia properly reveal the opposition in modern aesthetics and theories of the imagination to the triumphal idea of modernity, they don't allow for the full complexity of Hegel's idealism. Rebecca Comay's sorrowful owl in Mourning Sickness: Hegel and the French Revolution is a more representative reading for those who have tarried longer with Hegel. Nonetheless, Miller does clarify Kristeva's relation to aesthetic theory and notions of the imagination after Hegel. The device of couples works, above all, to illuminate Kristeva's own sense of a distinctive imaginary temporality of modernity that is revealed in modern art and writing, for example in the temporal structure of the photograph as emphasized by Benjamin and Barthes. Modern art and writing access the limits of the representable and the thinkable just where the imaginary realm is threatened -- as does psychoanalysis in a different way. With Miller, Kristeva's articulation of this distinctive temporality of return and renewal owes much to a supple inheritance of Hegel and Freud on negativity and negation, but requires above all the ability to bring psychoanalysis into relation with modern art and writing without reducing either to the other.

One of the most well developed chapters does this by linking Kristeva's thought on allegory with Benjamin's. The allegorist, for Benjamin, is the one to whom are exposed the things drained of life by melancholy. Allegorical art translates the melancholia of modernity into a style. It manifests the state of affairs and finds ways to address it without false promises of redemption. With Miller, this idea of allegory continues in Kristeva's attention to installation art, which includes a sense of temporality and narrative. Miller herself finds contemporary allegorical art in the countermemorial to traumatic events, begun in Germany, and in Rachel Whiteread's sculptures. The countermemorial is melancholic in refusing to leave the past behind, even in the form of a consecrated memory, and in "saying something other (allos) in a public way (agorein)" (49). The casting of negative spaces in Whiteread's closets and domestic interiors are also melancholic art in this sense. Miller prefers Whiteread's interiors to her own countermemorial, Nameless Library, the Judenplatz Holocaust Memorial in Vienna. Perhaps she misses an opportunity, here, to develop the question of melancholic art further by considering unique features of the memorial that have been discussed by other commentators on Whiteread. One feature is the replacement of negative by positive castings, which prevents the artist's style from dominating the work (Comay). Another is the sculptural-architectural operations of the memorial, which turn elements of its symbolic and architectural surroundings into the viewer, displacing the artist and spectator as witness (Rachel Carley).

These features might complement Miller's discussion of Kristeva and Adorno, in which the former's focus on the icon and iconoclasm, privileging an art that inscribes or suggests rather than represents its subject, is brought into relation with Adorno's ban on representational thinking, the image character of consciousness. Adorno's iconoclasm lies in his thought on nonidentical mimesis, which does not permit the utopic moment, the way out, to be positively pictured. It's possible that engaging with rather than passing over Nameless Library could have allowed an artwork to be one way of transitioning from one couple to another -- from Kristeva and Benjamin to Adorno and Kristeva. However, it must be acknowledged that the aesthetic ideas in one part of Miller's discussion tend to be interrupted by, rather than seamlessly developing into, the ideas of another part. This raises the question of how Miller handles the transitions in her different chapters. She does so, initially, on the ground of a shared sense of iconoclasm in Kristeva, Benjamin and Adorno. At other moments theoretical considerations pave the way. Miller often lets Kristeva's own sense of a passage from negativity in Hegel to Freud on negation, one concept making room for another, carry the reader through the changes in focus. In a third strategy, each new set of aesthetic ideas is shown to be another way of exploring the non-representational origins of symbolic life. Here Freud usually makes an appearance, especially where the problem of depression resurfaces and can be thematized in terms of the elements of the psychical capacity to represent experience and, thence, in terms of the explorations in modern art and writing of the elements and limits of representation.

Miller nonetheless finds Kristeva developing ideas in modern philosophy and aesthetics that arose, first, in thinkers who preceded or ignored Freud: the sublime in Kant, irony and tragedy in Hegel, natality in Arendt. Her monograph also brings readers' notice to some unusual translations of Freudian notions into aesthetic ideas in Kristeva. Thus Freud is never the explanatory ground for Kristeva's relation to art and literature. His notion of the uncanny has become an aesthetic idea, along with the related problem of the foreign, where Kristeva develops it in relation to categories of the sublime and irony in Kant and Hegel. What allows pre-Freudian aesthetics to have this effect on psychoanalytic concepts, giving the former a role in transforming the latter into aesthetic ideas for today, is largely the presence of Adorno and Benjamin. Adorno did of course pay attention to Freud. However, it is Benjamin who precedes Kristeva in grasping this process in which Freudian notions emerge as aesthetic ideas. There is, first, Benjamin's use of the term spiritual inoculation to describe writing or art that translates the melancholia of modernity into style rather than maintaining it as an affect or specific theme. Miller's use of the term spiritual inoculation does much to foregather the upcoming couples in a preliminary way. The inoculatory effect of style in melancholic art avoids a paralyzing attitude to the past. In the Kristevan perspective, it resexualizes drives that are frozen into monotonous repetition by loss, allowing for creativity through a re-eroticization of suffering and existence, a thought that will come to link Benjamin with Proust.

The second notion of Benjamin's that precedes the translation process in Kristeva is the notion of the optical unconscious, preserving a moment of lost time and revealed, for Benjamin, by techniques in photography. The idea of the optical unconscious prefigures the appearance in Miller's book of the severed head, beyond the psychical trace of the lost mother, as a figure for the promise of what could be otherwise (Kristeva with Adorno). It also prefigures Kristeva's proposal of a veritable art of the uncanny. Miller shows Kristeva developing her own thought on negativity and foreignness in an idea of the uncanny that is related to aesthetic categories of irony and the sublime, moving from Kant to Hegel to Kafka. Finally, Kristeva presents an aesthetic concept of forgiveness -- "aesthetic pardon" -- developed out of the dual commitment to Hegel and Freud once this is given a special character through a reading of Klein on reparation. Aesthetic pardon appears to mean a "post-moral" form of forgiveness opened up by theological forgiveness but moving beyond it, again following Hegel. Aesthetic pardon is given in the setting up a form, of poiesis, which takes over once religion no longer has the power of its promise of "rebirth of the subject in a new temporality." With Miller, in aesthetic pardon the artist and perhaps the reader/viewer are located in a "transubstantiation" that gives a "second life" of form and meaning, going beyond psychological transformation in the acts of naming and composing the narrative form. Miller runs this idea through Greek tragedy, specifying that Orestes has become more significant than Oedipus for the relations between severance, conflicts, and an enriched form of subjectivity and culture. This discussion completes Miller's portrayal of aesthetic ideas arising out of and beyond the Freudian text, via what preceded it in philosophical aesthetics.

It is evident that Miller's view of philosophy and art in depressed times covers proliferating sets of aesthetic ideas in relation to the psychical ability to register impressions and their meaningful value for the subject, as well as what deadens this ability. Miller's conclusion returns to the more slender moments of psychical and cultural renewal that keep open the possibility of great writers and even of the imagination of a new order of existence in a period that, lacking great writers, faces a future that may be determined by the technical logics contributing to the depreciation of the imaginary realm. Overall, her book provides the reader with a sure sense of Kristeva's aesthetic interests. It particularly illuminates her idea of a distinctive imaginary temporality of return and renewal in modern writing that recognizes the melancholia of our age and so does not ignore the tendency to depreciation and diminishing of the imaginary realm that comes with the rise of instrumental reason and the society of the spectacle.

There are three issues for which I would like to see a further development of Miller's approach. Some of the constellations of aesthetic ideas work better than others simply because they are taken at a slower pace. First, then, it would be interesting to see the links between certain ideas articulated at greater length, for example, between negativity and alterity, the latter being a psychoanalytic emphasis that is a little submerged in Miller's emphasis on negativity and temporality. Second, a more measured approach would be bound to raise the tensions between the parties in the couples that Miller stages -- between Adorno and Kristeva on the psyche and the social, for example -- and that tend to be suppressed. Third, the threads of melancholic modernity are rather loosely tied by Miller because she does not venture to consider the analysis of modernity that appears in thought on modern nihilism beginning with Nietzsche, on disenchantment in Adorno, or on the relation of psychoanalysis to religion, the last having become increasingly prominent in Kristeva's recent writings. However, as I said at the outset, such a monograph must choose its emphasis and its path through this prolific thinker carefully. Monographs on figures as sensitive as Kristeva is to the problems of existence and representation in modernity, and as fine-grained on the complex temporalities in modern writing, will err somewhat on one side or the other. The philosophical reconstruction of modern art and writing may organize the phenomena rather too neatly under its concepts. Alternatively, the reader can be left in some slight confusion by a broad coverage of the fragments. Miller's general approach to Kristeva opens up more possibilities for thinking about her significance in relation to modern aesthetics than a highly reflective but narrow path-forging would do.