Health and the Good Society: Setting Healthcare Ethics in Social Context

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Alan Cribb, Health and the Good Society: Setting Healthcare Ethics in Social Context, Oxford University Press, 2005, 236pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199242739.

Reviewed by Lynette Reid, Dalhousie University


For many of us working in bioethics, the most exciting movement in our field is what Alan Cribb calls the "social turn" in healthcare ethics. A touchstone for Cribb's framework-building project in Health and the Good Society is the question: how do clinical ethics and public health ethics come together?

"Framework" can mean more than one thing. It can mean a code to apply, like a checklist, to determine the ethical acceptability of a proposed course of action. One familiar proposal in this area is that public health's emphasis on the common good can correct the bioethicist's emphasis on individual choice (see for instance (Kass 2001)). This would have us re-prioritize items on the checklist. "Framework" can also mean something more like a map of the terrain or an exploration of the conceptual space within which the questions at hand arise and may be treated: a disciplinary (re)configuration. Cribb is after the latter kind of "framework," specifically with methodological intent. Bioethics has always brought together philosophers, lawyers, and doctors to contribute their distinct expertises; what Cribb advocates is an integration of this evolving project with the social sciences: history of medicine, social studies of technology, medical sociology and anthropology, not to mention political science and policy studies. These come to the bioethical enterprise not as "add-ons:" they bring deep engagement with, and contextualization and scrutiny of, the very terms in which the traditional partners in bioethics operate.

With a nod to the late Peter Winch on the relationship of philosophy and the social sciences, Cribb signals the depth of significance of this growth from interdisciplinarity to multidisciplinarity: not only do conceptual and empirical work complement one another, empirical work shows us what is meant by the concepts, whose reality lies to a significant degree in their enactment.

The "social turn" not only is multi-faceted, but also its various strands may well pull in different directions. His sensitivity to such variety, and the unexpected alliances and conflicts it can produce, particularly marks Cribb's style of thinking. His writing is at once conversational and highly abstract. The book is both an engaging and a challenging read. He has so many dimensions of insight to keep in play at once that the effect is at times dizzying. Towards the end I felt engaged in a good mystery: into what picture are these nuanced sketches all going to settle?

The first section of the book, "The evolving value field of healthcare," surveys the lay of the land as we undergo the contemporary "diffusion of the health agenda." This phrase is meant to capture both the development of an all-encompassing definition of healthcare goals, and the engagement of more actors in the processes of reaching those goals. A central theme of the work is the question who is to be involved in defining those goals.

The second chapter, "Producing the goods," deals with the question of how widely or narrowly to define the ends of healthcare: absence of disease, welfare, or well-being? Too broad a definition risks saddling the healthcare system with the impossible goal of universal human happiness; too narrow a definition risks blindness to the psychosocial determinants of health and the social context of the biological. While recognizing the dangers, Cribb opts for the devil over the deep blue sea. It is difficult to evaluate his choice for the narrower definition, however, because it is unclear whether anything Cribb argues in the remainder of the book relies on his having adopted it.

"Participating in health decisions," the third chapter, is a discussion of the social turn in the form of the broadening of agency within healthcare. Cribb offers a critique of the ideal of patient autonomy as an example. Arguing against patient autonomy as implying parity in the doctor-patient relationship, he engages with autonomy as a philosopher's abstraction, not seriously considering its roots in the women's health movement and the development of patient self-help groups.

One could phrase his point not so much as a criticism of the ideal, but as the point that even in a "value field" that places emphasis on patient autonomy, there remain special responsibilities of healthcare professionals, and challenges about education and social reform for the enactment of the ideal.

The second section orients us in the "value field" of health policy ethics, where the prominent idea of "health promotion" signifies something between a movement and a "cluster of reforming discourses," where distributive justice is an important value, and where health-related responsibilities are in transition.

The fourth chapter, "Health promotion in the good society," is his first significant discussion of health promotion, an example to which he returns repeatedly in the book. Cribb's chief contributions come in his style of repeated reconsideration of the same examples in different contexts and with different lenses (rather than in making tightly circumscribed arguments): each successive approximation deepens our understanding and raises fruitful new questions.

As agendas broaden, totalizing becomes a danger: if every decision has health effects and every good is a good of human flourishing, hence a component of health broadly understood, will this bring (Cribb asks) a medicalization of all life and society? Should the design of traffic systems, the choice of leisure time activities, and home decoration all be seen as falling within medical purview? What happens when I come to the doctor's for a consultation about my sore ankle and leave with recommended bed times and a reading list designed to round out my character and soften its harder edges?

One of the more provocative questions of the book is whether the clinical encounter is an ethically-circumscribed "safe harbour" in which health promotion can take place, or whether health promotion disrupts the clinical encounter, importing values and enactments of values that are at odds with ethical expectations between clinicians and patients. It can be difficult to focus the question: sometimes when Cribb poses it, one wants to protest (as he acknowledges) that doctors have always had the challenge of health promotion as part of their role. With other iterations, Cribb succeeds in bringing his concerns into stronger focus: what if denial of services is considered a legitimate tool of health promotion (such as limiting medical treatment for smokers), so that the clinician is denying rather than providing care -- in the service of public health? And since health promotion is enacted through specific managerial regimes, what if she does so in order to reach mandated outcome measures for her health region -- and enjoys a nice bonus on her income for playing her role?

Ambivalence of commitment is (perhaps) the chief sin of the subtle intellect: Cribb's endorsement of tackling health inequities in his fifth chapter ("The distribution of health and healthcare") doesn't get much stronger than "it is possible, at least in principle, not only that some health inequalities are matters of injustice which might be rectifiable but also that some methods of rectification are broadly consistent with other good ends and are, as methods, ethically defensible" (p. 95). This is hardly a slogan to galvanize the American electorate for healthcare reform, revitalise the NHS, or save Medicare from the Supreme Court in Canada. He proposes that we focus on improving the health and illness experience of the most disadvantaged, an approach that foregrounds the personal and narrative aspect of the social turn while backgrounding (but not eliminating) a population-level concern for outcome measures with all the managerialism that may imply.

The sixth chapter, "Responsibility for health," was especially challenging to grasp, but it repays the effort. Cribb has a serious perspective shift to offer bioethics, and this chapter gives an example: he considers again the question of limiting treatment to smokers (penalizing risk-taking behaviour through the denial of healthcare), not in order to make a substantive contribution to the debate, but in order to point out how broader questions about healthcare system design and the values enacted in the healthcare system stand in the background, and how we might begin to get a handle on these in bioethics. Against the abstract philosophical questions (for a utilitarian) "is it good for A to do x?" or (for a deontologist) "does A have the right to do (not do) x?" Cribb poses the real-world health-system embedded question: "what responsibility does B have to do y in order to underpin A's doing x?" And now all sorts of political questions about the organization of healthcare systems, about power and legitimacy, about professional roles and what Cribb calls the "ethical division of labour" come to the fore.

The third section of the book is most richly suggestive of future dissertations and research programs: Cribb outlines in the seventh chapter ("Professional ethics in context") the many ways in which internal perspectives (the subject matter of anthropological and philosophical bioethicists) and external perspectives (the subject matter of sociological and historical bioethicists) on the values of health professions cannot afford to remain divorced from one another: the naivety of the one ("the practice of medicine is intrinsically altruistic") and the cynicism of the other ("and the reputation for altruism buys doctors unique privileges of self-regulation and a nice pay packet to boot") both capture truths, and Cribb challenges our multidisciplinary project to come to terms with this.

If that's not enough of a challenge, the eighth chapter on "Managing healthcare" lays out the impact of particular policy enactments -- particular managerial regimes -- on the "ethical division of labour." Typical managerial reforms come wrapped in such commonsense language (quality, value for money, more for less) that the fundamental shifts they impose may never come up for debate. Touching on the "responsibilization" theme, Cribb argues that real responsibilization would involve engaging the public not through behaviour-manipulation but by engaging them in broad debate over the values we want to enact, how we enact them, with whom the responsibility lies, and with what legitimacy.

I thought that with these points about managerialism and professional ethics, I had reached the central thesis of the book, and the last section would draw implications and summarize. Cribb took me by surprise: the tenth chapter, "Rethinking health education," refers not immediately to professional education; rather, it's the occasion for a vigorous critique of the idea that promoting a slogan ("Don't drink and drive") is something worthy of the name "health education" at all. The problem of patient autonomy from the third chapter is not to be solved by re-embracing paternalism (as one might have thought was his point) but by bringing down the barriers between professional and lay health education. The MMR vaccine-Autism scare is Cribb's example. Bland reassurance, however necessary, is not "education," and he argues that the opportunity was lost in this case to uncover the real concerns of the public and to engage in real "education for participation" around the nature of public health policy formation and epidemiological evidence.

Faced with the choice between efficacy and accuracy, some would say that we have an obligation to opt for the short message that works. I would argue that we have seen this fear before: "perhaps patients don't want all that information; perhaps the obligation to assimilate information will stand between them and the treatment they need." It turns out not to be the case; information is not a barrier to treatment. Information doesn't preclude reassurance, and some will not be reassured without genuine dialogue.

Cribb's proposal for the rapprochement of bioethics and public health ethics turns out not to be the familiar proposal of setting limits on informed consent (sacrificing autonomy for utility), but creating procedures of informed consent (education for participation, true responsibilization) for public health and the healthcare agenda writ large. Cribb's disruption of my expectation that the issues are to be solved by changes in professional education is deliberate. He is raising the question: with what legitimacy can healthcare managerial regimes reallocate professional and lay responsibilities without public engagement?

The eleventh chapter, "Towards a socially reflexive healthcare ethics," gives diagram-form to Cribb's framework for public health and clinical ethics (his figure 3, discussed at pp. 201-203): a given action requires, apart from its traditional ethical scrutiny and fine tuning, evaluation as a cultural/conceptual intervention and scrutiny on political grounds: beneath/behind/below these three kinds of evaluation are rich multidisciplinary empirical/conceptual investigations. Apart from the traditional ethical appraisal of a vaccine program, for instance, we must recognize that such a program is a social and cultural intervention: informed consent for public health requires taking serious alternative conceptions prevalent in the community, conceptions that reject scientific orthodoxy, for instance (as in the MMR vaccine-autism case), and that this ought to become a task for bioethicists. In addition to being a social and cultural intervention, it is also a policy enactment within a polity: restricting access to education to enforce vaccination, for instance, needs consideration of how access to education plays into citizenship in this particular state and culture (or constellation of cultures), what other policy goals may be enhanced or disrupted by tying education and public health together, how such a policy might enhance or disrupt their relationship to education, healthcare, the state and their social context more generally.

In the final chapter, "Making the health agenda," Cribb steps back to consider the shape or shaping of the health agenda as such. Globalization comes onto the plate -- not such a surprise, given Cribb's concern for managerialism on the table from chapter eight, in a world where the World Bank dismantles healthcare systems in the name of cutting social spending and the language of the globally competitive corporation drives reforms in healthcare systems. Globalization pushes against the community's ability to organize itself for action in the form of government initiatives; the biotech imperative continues to fracture healthcare into individual units of treatment and outcome. The social turn could formulate responses to each: concern with equitable distribution on the one hand, concern with person-centered care on the other.

Cribb closes the book with the introduction of a new object of fear: what if the diffusion of the healthcare agenda proves to be overwhelming? What if it has every bit as much power to bankrupt the healthcare system as endless technological innovation has? The drive to improve our lived, identity-forming experiences of healthcare is potentially limitless. What if, in short, the social turn's answer to the biotech imperative swamps the social turn's answer to globalization?

But is this "what if" anything more than a thought experiment? Similar anxieties appear throughout the book, sometimes in the form of concern about the aspirational and all-encompassing quality of well-being, sometimes in the form of the fear of medicalization of the whole of human life. Ideals, whether technological or humanist, individualistic or social, often have this limitless quality. Cribb eventually sharpens the sense of threat by arguing that managerial practices privilege individualized units of success: the challenge of having a wealthy and powerful professional system (such as the healthcare system is, however much under strain) deliver improved holistic services is small compared to the challenge of defeating poverty and creating democratic processes robust enough to direct social agendas broadly understood. In the medical school where I teach, indeed, there are banners promoting healthy mind -- body -- spirit hanging in the lobby and none promoting an end to poverty and inequality. What in the world constructs these potentially complementary areas of concern into an either-or choice?


Kass, N. E. 2001. An ethics framework for public health. American Journal of Public Health 91, no. 11:1776-1782.