Health, Rights, and Dignity: Philosophical Reflections on an Alleged Human Right

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Christian Erk, Health, Rights, and Dignity: Philosophical Reflections on an Alleged Human Right, Ontos, 2010, 385pp., $139.95 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380934.

Reviewed by Henk ten Have, Center for Healthcare Ethics, Duquesne University


The Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) states that "everyone has the right to a standard of living adequate for the health and well-being of himself and of his family, including food, clothing, housing and medical care" (Article 25.1). Two years earlier the Constitution of the World Health Organization declared, "The enjoyment of the highest attainable standard of health is one of the fundamental rights of every human being without distinction of race, religion, political belief, economic or social condition". Both texts are usually taken as the expression of health as a fundamental human right. Since then, this right has been included in many international and regional documents, and even in the Constitution of several states. At the same time, the right to health is not well known. At the occasion of the sixtieth anniversary of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, an editorial in The Lancet, presenting a thematic issue on the right to health, complained that the health sector has been silent because of "the general lack of understanding about what the right to health is and what it means in practice" (Editorial, 2008: 2001).

Although the right to health is the basis for myriad practical and legal activities, particularly in the area of global public health, the philosophical and normative foundations of the right to health are contested. These are exactly the issues addressed and analyzed in this book. The author, Christian Erk undertakes an elaborate reflection on the philosophical foundations of the human right to health. He asks whether the human right to health can exist, and if so what it would entail from a philosophical perspective. Answering this question requires a theoretical examination of three basic notions in contemporary global bioethics: health, human rights, and dignity. Erk's analysis finally leads him to conclude that health cannot be conceived as a human right that is a right of all human beings and that is derived from the inherent dignity of human beings. Although it is common to make a distinction between the right to health and the right to health care, this distinction is not relevant for Erk since his work is focused on the question whether health can be conceptualized as a human right.

In chapter I Erk outlines the basic problem: the human right to health is a mystery. Human rights are mainly a practical achievement with a lack of theory. According to Erk there is no universal concept of human rights and theoretical foundations of such rights presented by philosophers are very diverse in his view. This is even more the case for the right to health as stated in international documents. This right is mentioned and 'declared' in a plethora of documents but it is almost never explained or justified. This seems like a typical philosophers' complaint: international legal documents never provide definitions of basic notions (such as 'health', 'human dignity' or 'human being'). Asking for a definition in international negotiations usually is asking for trouble. In many cases one can easily proceed without definitions. One can even argue that for core concepts universally agreed definitions are lacking. But philosophers like Erk need definitions and clarity. They also assume that we can only justify a practice if there is an underpinning theory. Erk knows very well that there are many efforts in philosophy to provide theoretical foundations but he rejects them as insufficient. He also acknowledges that human rights are explained as legal, thus positive, rights and are specified in policy requirements, but he rejects this because human rights are also moral rights in need of a moral theory. The reader needs to keep these philosophical assumptions in mind while reading this book.

In Chapter II Erk intends to clarify the concept of health. This is a bold endeavor especially since he presents his own theory of health that will unveil the enigma of health. The scholastic analysis of various dimensions of health (positive vs. negative, static vs. dynamic, subjective, objective and social) begins with a section on life and death. This follows the statement that life is the precondition of health. A classical distinction is made between 'biological' and 'mental' (or 'rational') life, but the purpose of this distinction for the remainder of the chapter is not clear. Erk then discusses three current concepts/theories of health: the holistic concept of WHO, the bio-statistical theory of Boorse and the normativist theory of Nordenfelt. All three are dismissed as inadequate; he calls the second theory 'reductionist' and the third one 'relativist'. Erk is searching for a definition of health that expresses its essence and does not equates it with its functions, e.g., abilities or capabilities. This distinction between essence and function plays an important role also later in the book.

Arguing that health has three dimensions (objective, subjective and social), Erk concludes that health primarily is a good habit, a certain kind of disposition. Health is not a static given but can be influenced by various determinants, e.g., biological, behavioral, social and environmental ones. Some of these determinants can be influenced by our behavior, so that the argument then focuses on 'health behavior'. Individual choices, actions and behaviors can influence health. The implication is that health is an individual matter. In the end health is determined by behavior of individuals. This emphasis on individual behavior at the same time assumes that many determinants of health cannot be influenced by policy or collective action, a reduction that will have serious implications for the analysis of the right to health. The resulting 'comprehensive theory of health' combines three aspects of health: health as a norm or standard, health as a state, and health as good habit. Very little is said however about health as a norm. Without much ado priority is give to the 'human natural-biological norm which is discovered by the bio-medical sciences as well as the humanities" (p. 131). It is also unclear how these three aspects work together to provide a coherent view. Complementing a static view of health with a dynamic one does not automatically produce a theory. It is a pity that Erk has not used the work of Georges Canguilhem (1943) who saw health as a dynamic concept, as adaptability. It is possible Erk did not like this theory because of the distinction between essence and function. But there is no reason to postulate that an essence cannot be dynamic.

Erk analyzes the concepts of (human) right, duty and human dignity in chapter III. Here he fully exploits his classificatory talents. Using Hohfeld, he makes distinctions between various categories of rights (claim, liberty, power, immunity as well as molecular rights), active and passive rights, rights in personam and rights in rem. He also clarifies duties (e.g., the distinction between perfect and imperfect duties). Based on these distinctions Erk concludes that the right to health cannot imply a positive claim-right to be healthy. The argument is pragmatic since this right can never be realized because many health determinants are beyond the individual's control (p. 159). This conclusion is predetermined by the individual scope of the analysis. The concept of health has been associated with individual behavior. Social and environmental determinants of health are placed out of reach. And the analysis of rights is purely individualistic: "this thesis is about health as an individual right" (p. 140). The result of this eradication of social context and common good is that there are no moral positive claim-rights (to goods, assistance, and aid), there are only moral positive duties (that are thus imperfect).

The most interesting part of the book in my view is the analysis of human dignity. This concept is usually taken as the foundation of human rights. Erk distinguishes three dimensions or sources of human dignity: intrinsic dignity, inflorescent dignity and attributed dignity. The first dimension is commonly referred to in human rights discourse. It is related to the nature of human beings, in particular the notion of personhood. The other dimensions of dignity are contingent. They depend on the actualization of the person's capabilities, thus not only being a person but functioning as a person, or on the quality of the actualization. Both are forms of inflorescent dignity, having to do with the flourishing of human beings. The third dimension (attributed dignity) is not rooted in the human being itself but awarded by other people, nature, or God. With these dimensions, human dignity will not be equal for everyone. Only if dignity is regarded as ontological is it an egalitarian and inalienable concept (this is in Erk's words "the minimal amount of human dignity"). Because all human beings have this dignity, it demands respect by others. This dimension of dignity grants a passive right which obliges others. Therefore, human rights are only passive negative moral rights.

Applying the closing argument of the previous chapter, a human right to health can only exist as a passive negative claim-right grounded in the ontological dignity of human beings. Chapter IV, the book's last, concludes that it does not. Health can only be a human right if it is connected to the ontological dignity of human beings. But being a person does not depend on health. Ergo, "health cannot be conceptualized as a human right" (p. 307). Health can only be a moral right if derived from the human right to life or from the moral duty to life. Any reference to human dignity as a foundational justification is mistaken. The implication is that international and national documents stipulating that health is a fundamental human right must be wrong; their statements are simply "nonsensical and untenable" (p. 328). Another implication is that the right to health care cannot be derived from the right to health; if this last right is a passive negative moral right it cannot be someone else's duty for care for the health of other persons.

Although the conclusion is disappointing, this is a very interesting book with elaborated analyses of fundamental concepts. Sometimes there are long detours and digressions, for example about biological and mental life, virtue theory (to show that health is not a virtue), or the notion of personhood (leading into the debate on the status of the embryo). Erk also uses a particular argumentation strategy: first dissect the concept in general, show that there are various dimensions in the classification, and then demonstrate that the concept as used is only covering a tiny fraction of the classification. Applied to the concepts of health and human rights, it results in a reductionist view of both concepts. The right to health is a complicated concept from a philosophical point of view. But the paradox is that in practice it seems to work as a legal instrument. It is an effective tool to make sure that the best conditions are created to ensure health. The theoretical vagueness of the concept is in a way made more precise by describing obligations and specifying rules of engagement. The emphasis nowadays is increasingly on implementation strategies, formulating specifications and key elements as well as indicators to measure right-to-health requirements, and on setting up health-systems monitoring (Backman et al. 2008).

In her study on globalization of clinical trials, anthropologist Adriana Petryna (2009) shows how the right to health is used and misused in Brazil. Since 1988 the Brazilian Constitution guarantees universal access to health as a basic right: "Health is the right of all and the duty of the state". The right to health however, is immediately implemented as the right to health care. Health coverage is extended to all citizens through the national health system. Essential medication is available for common diseases and treatments. High cost medicines (known in Brazil as exceptional medicines) are purchased and distributed by the Ministry of Health; public access is limited. With this system, the government guarantees basic health care to all citizens. But the system is exploited by industry-sponsored research. Drug firms are using the human rights instrument to disseminate their products. They initiate clinical trials for testing expensive drugs for rare diseases. They enroll patients who otherwise have no access to these drugs. Then after completion of the trial, there is no post-trial treatment. The companies are arguing that it is up to the government to provide the drugs. They instruct trial subjects about the specifics of their right to health. They help patients put pressure on the government to purchase the drugs and they recommend litigation. The government is now overwhelmed by litigation. The costs for exceptional medication are going up. In some states about 50% of the available budget is now spent for essential medicines. The prices for orphan drugs are inordinately high because the government is not in control of the price. The price is usually set in the United States where there is no price control. This is an example of how the right to health can be used and misused when it is translated into health care for various purposes rather than for the goal of promoting public health. But this is not due to philosophical misunderstandings.


Backman, G., Hunt, P., Khosla, R. et al.: Health systems and the right to health: an assessment of 194 countries. The Lancet 2008 (372): 2047-85.

Canguilhem, Georges: Le normal et le pathologique. Presses Universitaires de France, Paris, 1943/1966 (10th edition 2007; English translation: The Normal and the Pathological, trans. Carolyn R. Fawcett & Robert S. Cohen, New York: Zone Books, 1991).

Editorial: The right to health: from rhetoric to reality. The Lancet 2008 (372): 2001.

Petryna, Adriana: When experiments travel. Clinical trials and the global search for human subjects. Princeton University Press: Princeton, 2009.