Hegel and Resistance: History, Politics and Dialectics

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Rebecca Comay and Bart Zantvoort (eds.), Hegel and Resistance: History, Politics and Dialectics, Bloomsbury, 2018, 205pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350003644.

Reviewed by Stephen Houlgate, University of Warwick


Bart Zantvoort begins his introduction to this collection by reminding us that "the history of modern philosophy can be read as a history of resistance to Hegel." (p. 1). Such resistance is encountered in the founders of the analytical tradition, Moore and Russell, as well as in the "post-metaphysical and anti-totality critiques running from Heidegger to Levinas, Derrida and Deleuze". As Zantvoort recognizes, however, much of this resistance is based on an "overly simplistic" interpretation of Hegel as a totalizing thinker who absorbs whatever appears to be other than reason into reason itself (p. 2). The refreshing aim of this collection is to consider a different issue: the place of resistance in Hegel's philosophy itself. The essays examine Hegel's understanding of resistance in its various forms, and also the role that resistance plays in his thought whether or not he is aware of it. They all are interesting and well written; as will become clear below, however, some are based on interpretations of Hegel's thought that I find it hard to share.

One of the best essays is by Karin de Boer, who considers whether, as is often claimed, Hegel was against all forms of political resistance or dissent. De Boer provides thoughtful and illuminating discussions of the Preface to Hegel's Philosophy of Right, as well as the sections on civil society and the state, and comes to the conclusion that in that work Hegel does indeed "disregard the possibility of justified massive dissent" (p. 148). She maintains that, in Hegel's view, dissent, and even revolution, may be required if the rational core of a modern state is to "break through its irrational bark" (as the example of France shows), but that dissent does not belong to the rational state itself, which is the topic of the Philosophy of Right. This is because in a fully rational state, as Hegel conceives it, "citizens would have no reason to oppose the government and would of their own accord identify with the interests of the society as a whole" (p. 148). De Boer is clearly sympathetic to Hegel's attempt to balance the freedom of individuals with the interests of society at large, but she sees a danger in what she takes to be Hegel's complete exclusion of dissent from the rational state. The danger is that such exclusion leaves Hegel unable to distinguish between two kinds of opposition to government, namely legitimate opposition by advocates of human rights and illegitimate, self-serving opposition by "ruthless lobbyists of multinationals". This, de Boer maintains, is "a major shortcoming of the Philosophy of Right" (p. 150).

De Boer's concern is eloquently expressed, but in my view it rests on ignoring two important aspects of Hegel's rational state. On the one hand, such a state not only protects the interests of society against the unrestricted pursuit by individuals of their own particular interests, but also guarantees the fundamental rights of such individuals.[1] Resistance to the rational state as a whole can thus only come from those who reject such rights (such as, perhaps, the "ruthless lobbyists" that de Boer has in mind). On the other hand, Hegel recognises that even in a rational state members of one branch, the executive, may seek to "misuse" their power in an arbitrary way and thereby threaten both the "governed" and the rationality of the state. Consequently, Hegel argues, communities and corporations must have the legal right to resist such misuse of power.[2] In this sense, pace de Boer, there is some right of resistance in Hegel's rational state, if not against that state as a whole.

Klaus Vieweg goes further and argues with characteristic vigour that, for Hegel, there is a right of resistance in every form of freedom -- in abstract right, morality, civil society and the state. He insists that Hegel regards freedom and right as inviolable (pp. 162-3). Such inviolability in turn, Vieweg maintains, grounds the right of individuals and communities to resist the violation of their rights by, for example, political tyranny or systematic poverty -- the right to negate the negation of right. So slaves have the right to free themselves from bondage, free persons have the right to defend themselves against violence and theft, and the poor have the right to rebel against the conditions of their poverty (pp. 163-6). Such resistance, it should be noted, is always in the name of right, not merely power or arbitrary self-interest: it is resistance against injustice for the sake of justice. There can, therefore, be no right of resistance against justice itself, no "insurrection against reason and freedom" (p. 167).

This last idea, however, makes it necessary to qualify Vieweg's otherwise persuasive arguments in a way he does not do explicitly himself. Vieweg shows convincingly that, for Hegel, free individuals have the right to resist injustice; but if there is no right of resistance against reason, freedom and justice, there can be no such right against the fully rational state. In such a state, therefore, individuals would not be called on to provide resistance, but injustice would be prevented from arising in the first place by the state and its institutions (though, as noted above, communities and corporations would retain the right to resist the executive, if necessary). Accordingly, in the rational state there would be no need for people to rebel against the condition of poverty, because the state and the corporations would ensure that there is no systematic poverty.[3]

Louis Carré adopts a very different view of poverty in his engaging essay on the "rabble" in Hegel's Philosophy of Right. Carré argues that, for Hegel, the impoverished rabble embodies the moment of "negativity" and "ethical dissolution" that civil society is incapable of eliminating (pp. 177, 186). Indeed, we are told, the rabble is the "countertendency" to Hegel's whole "system of right" that is inherent in that system itself: it is "one of the rare issues in Hegel's Philosophy of Right that exceeds and also somehow resists its systematic discourse" (p. 184). Carré points out that poverty and social inequality do not alone produce a rabble, but that the rabble arises when the poor feel deprived of their rights and lose respect for the rights of others (pp. 179-80). Importantly, he also notes that, for Hegel, there can be a rich rabble that is "just as impudent and shameless" in its actions as the poor rabble (p. 181). In my view, however, Carré's claim that the rabble resists and disrupts Hegel's whole system of right is ultimately unconvincing: for he fails to see that, for Hegel, civil society produces poverty and a rabble only when it is engaged in "unrestricted" activity, that is, only in the absence of corporations and the state proper.[4] He thus fails to see that in the fully rational state, as Hegel conceives it, there can be no systematic poverty or rabble.

In Hegel's philosophy of history, however, we learn that what emerges in history is never fully and unequivocally rational. Actual modern states, such as France, Britain and the Netherlands, are thus not perfectly, but only more or less, rational.[5] Some of the ways in which reality can "lag behind the development of reason" are explored in Zantvoort's subtle and intelligent essay on "inertia" in Hegel's theory of history (p. 123). Zantvoort points out that, for Hegel, historical development is not a smooth logical progression, but is rather full of "violence, setbacks and unexpected turns of event" (p. 118). Furthermore, it is a process in which forms of ethical life that are no longer rational or necessary can endure in an ossified form alongside new, more rational forms. In this way, old institutions resist change, "continue to live an 'undead', inert existence" and so prevent the present from being fully rational (p. 130).

Zantvoort provides an important corrective to the common view that reason in history, for Hegel, is unambiguously progressive, but I would add one qualification to his thesis. In history, as Hegel conceives it, inertia can certainly be understood to resist, delay and complicate progress. In the Phenomenology, however, inertia plays a different role: for in that work the inertia of consciousness -- its effort to remain what it is -- is itself what drives consciousness beyond itself. Zantvoort suggests that such inertia is overcome by a "principle of development" within consciousness (p. 120). In fact, however, that inertia itself causes consciousness to develop: consciousness moves forward precisely because it tries to stand still.[6]

This aspect of the Phenomenology is also missed -- to my mind, at least -- by Rebecca Comay in her otherwise subtle and at times brilliant essay on Hegel and Freud. For Comay, the central paradox of Freudian psychoanalysis, which mirrors the "essential paradox of the dialectic", is that such analysis can occur only if there is resistance to it (p. 46). The disclosure of truth by psychoanalysis can thus never be immediate, but requires an "impediment" that constantly delays such disclosure -- though analysis must also presuppose at the start that at the end "there will have been a final truth and purpose". Analysis, therefore, is always "ahead of itself", always already at the point it has not yet reached (pp. 47-8). Similarly, Comay argues, Hegel's Phenomenology can be read as a "catalogue of resistances" by consciousness that constantly threaten to postpone the absolute knowing that is the presupposed goal of Hegel's science (p. 52). Like Zantvoort, however, Comay fails to highlight the fact that the inertia of consciousness -- its seeking to preserve its identity -- is precisely what turns it, logically, into a new shape. Indeed, Comay does not appear to think that the development of consciousness set out in the Phenomenology has a logical structure in a strict sense. She talks eloquently of the "Baroque clutter" of "Hegel's stagecraft" and of the "prodigious inefficiency of the narrative" (p. 51), but she makes no mention of the fact that phenomenology discloses the logic inherent in consciousness.

Kirill Chepurin's illuminating essay highlights the role of resistance in Hegel's anthropology, rather than his phenomenology or philosophy of history. In particular, it explains how, for Hegel, the resistance of "the natural and the bodily" to their "idealization" by spirit is essential to the development of spirit itself (p. 101). Chepurin notes that nature's resistance is first encountered in feeling, in the fact that "the world resists the human touch" (p. 102). Spirit, however, seeks in turn to resist nature by transforming its natural environment and disciplining its own body through the formation of bodily habits that incarnate spiritual freedom (pp. 103-4). Yet the body continues to resist spirit's efforts to "counter-resist" it and so the development of individuals turns out to involve the continuing "mutual resistance between soul and body" (p. 104). Chepurin goes on to explain how the individual becomes a subject by forming itself into a "centre" to which it ties "every single sensation or feeling", that is, by resisting the "independence" of sensations (p. 106). Madness, by contrast, consists in resisting the unity of the subject and becoming fixated on some particular aspect of the self (p. 108). The development of spirit, for Hegel, thus entails a "constant resistance to madness" -- through the formation of habits that lend unity to the individual -- "every waking moment of an individual's life" (p. 111).

Frank Ruda goes further than the authors considered so far by arguing that resistance or "counterthrust" is an essential component of Hegel's method (p. 17). Indeed, Ruda claims that Hegel's method contains a counterthrust against itself, "against the thrust of his method" (p. 22). This counterthrust is to be found, we are told, in the speculative sentence. Yet Ruda's detailed analysis of the speculative sentence does not quite show what he wants it to: for it shows that such a sentence resists "common ways of thought" (p. 29), rather than the movement of speculative thought itself. Furthermore, his focus on the idea of repetition, together with what may be a slip of the pen, prevents him from explaining clearly how the speculative sentence works. Ruda writes that in such a sentence "the substance of the subject repeats in the subject" (p. 29, my emphasis), whereas Hegel's own claim, as I understand it, is rather that the subject of the sentence is redefined (not just repeated) in the predicate (not the subject itself).[7] Ruda's essay is, however, well worth reading, not only for its important focus on the speculative sentence, but also for its illuminating opening pages on Foucault in which Ruda argues that the latter is in fact "much more like the cliché version of Hegel than Hegel himself" (p. 21).

In her essay on Hegel, Benjamin and Adorno, Rocío Zambrana does not distinguish between the speculative sentence and the judgement as Ruda does, but she does highlight the importance for Hegel of reading the judgement or proposition "speculatively". Furthermore, she explains well how, when we read propositions in this way, the subject ceases to be the ground of predication and "the very act of predication" itself "articulates or unfolds the subject" (p. 62). Speculative thought, as Zambrana puts it, thus "resists understanding the given matter as static" and grasps the matter "in its unfolding, articulation, development". One might worry that thinking of speculative thought as resisting fixed understanding makes it appear that the former is external to the latter. Zambrana insists, however, that speculative thought brings out the dialectic that is immanent in the matter at hand: in her words, "dialectics seeks to assess any given matter on the basis of its own concept" (p. 61). In the remainder of her essay Zambrana examines how Benjamin and Adorno conceive of dialectic and how their conceptions echo but also differ from Hegel's. Her conclusion is that, for all three, dialectic is a critical practice that "interrupts" all forms of reification (pp. 59, 73). I would like to have seen Zambrana consider the (from a Hegelian viewpoint, problematic) fact that post-Hegelian dialectic does not appear to be genuinely immanent. Her essay, however, nicely clarifies the similarities and differences between Hegel, Benjamin and Adorno in just fourteen pages.

Less helpful, in my view, is Howard Caygill's wide ranging, but ultimately unconvincing, essay that considers the place of resistance in Hegel's Phenomenology, Science of Logic and early theological writings. Caygill's principal claim is that in these different texts resistance proves to be "the suppressed condition of the freedom, infinity and thought of the absolute", a condition that is suppressed by a "prior and unthematized decision" on the part of Hegel (pp. 82, 85). Caygill's interpretation of Hegel, however, is questionable and is itself based on "prior and unthematised" assumptions. These are most evident in his account of "force and understanding" in the Phenomenology. Caygill's first assumption is that the force Hegel examines is indeed a force of resistance and that Hegel shows "active" and "reactive" force resisting each other. He then claims that Hegel "dissolves" such resistance by conceiving of the different aspects of force as "self-superseding", and that later he further "disables" force in order to turn it into a servant of law and a subordinate moment of "the infinite" (pp. 83-5). The problem with this reading is that force in the Phenomenology is not principally a force of resistance, but the movement of becoming its opposite, of expressing itself -- a movement that involves being solicited by and soliciting other forces, rather than their mutual resistance.[8] Furthermore, infinity is not introduced to suppress force but just is the "unrest of pure self-movement" that force proves to be, as the passage from Hegel cited by Caygill indicates (p. 85). There is, therefore, no evidence that Hegel "suppresses resistance" in the name of infinity in order to press on to the absolute, as Caygill claims.

To conclude this review, I should note that the essays do not appear in the collection in the order in which I have commented on them. They are divided into three groups entitled "Method" (Ruda, Comay, Zambrana), "Nature and Spirit" (Caygill, Chepurin, Zantvoort) and "Politics" (de Boer, Vieweg, Carré) with an introduction by Zantvoort and a short "Afterword" by Comay. I should also stress that, though I have been critical in some way of almost all the essays, I very much welcome this collection and enjoyed reading it. It is well edited and the essays approach the topic of resistance in original and thought-provoking ways. This is an important book and undoubtedly rewards close and careful study.

[1] See G.W.F. Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, ed. A.W. Wood, trans. H.B. Nisbet (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), 283-5 [§ 261, Remark and Addition].

[2] Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, 334 [§ 295].

[3] See Stephen Houlgate, An Introduction to Hegel. Freedom, Truth and History, 2nd ed. (Oxford: Blackwell, 2005), 203-6.

[4] See Hegel, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, 266, 272 [§§ 243-4, 253 Remark].

[5] Hegel claims, for example, that England is "proudly reliant on its own constitution and freedom", but also that it lacks many "institutions characterized by real freedom". See G.W.F. Hegel, The Philosophy of History, trans. J. Sibree (New York: Dover Publications, 1956), 454.

[6] See Stephen Houlgate, Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit (London: Bloomsbury, 2013), 8: "consciousness actually brings about this state of despair by itself, by holding on to its own certainties and experiencing the destructive consequences of so doing".

[7] See G.W.F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977), 39.

[8] See Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, 83-5.