Hegel and the Infinite: Religion, Politics, and Dialectic

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Slavoj Žižek, Clayton Crockett, and Creston Davis (eds.), Hegel and the Infinite: Religion, Politics, and Dialectic, Columbia University Press, 2011, 237pp., $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231143356.

Reviewed by Angelica Nuzzo, Graduate Center and Brooklyn College, CUNY


In the last decades, in the Anglo-American world in particular, publications on any aspect of Hegel's philosophy are usually prefaced by a discussion of the allegedly cogent reasons that have led the authors or editors to license such publications. Such justificatory prefaces replace themes such as 'Hegel today' or 'Hegel's actuality' that were the preferred proposition at the end of the last century, and aim as much at persuading the publisher of the worthiness of a Hegel-publication today as at persuading the contemporary reader of the fruitfulness of her study of Hegel.

The volume edited by Slavoj Žižek, Clayton Crockett, and Creston Davis opens precisely with such a justification. And in this regard their thesis -- or rather their agenda -- is a strong one. The value and possibility of philosophical discourse itself hinges, for the editors, on our reading of Hegel: today "Hegel has become the litmus test of thought and possibility," they emphatically declare (1). For the reading of Hegel reveals philosophy's political allegiance (which ultimately seems to come down, today as in the 1840s, to only two possibilities, "the Right, conservative side, or the Leftist, revolutionary side" (1), both in need of dialectical overcoming). But it also reveals philosophy's position vis à vis its own post-Hegelian (and often anti-Hegelian) history and the history of the contemporary, post-Hegelian world. The contemporary rendering of the old problematic of Hegel's "idealism" revolves around the charge of the totalizing effect of Hegel's logic, ontology, method, and philosophy of spirit and history (the authorities here are Levinas, Derrida, Lyotard, Deleuze).

In his introductory remarks, Žižek insists on rectifying the all too common distorted view that framing Hegel's philosophy in terms of his "absolute idealism" -- and of its updated kin, the idea of "totalization" -- misses the relevance of Hegel's philosophy for the contemporary world. He hints instead at the intriguing idea that on the basis of Hegel's philosophy a sort of "phenomenology of the Twentieth-Century" could be written. Indeed, Žižek announces, "the time of Hegel still lies ahead" (xi). Hegel is the philosopher of the future, maintains Žižek in Alexandre Kojève's aftermath.

Crockett and Davis insist on the deep connection that binds Hegel's philosophy, in its inspiration and intellectual validity, to politics. Accordingly, the political implications of any contemporary philosophical discourse can be measured and put to test in the confrontation with Hegel. Following Žižek, Crockett and Davis reject the charges brought against Hegel by the Levinas-Derrida-Lyotard-Deleuze front (and by the "stereotypical post-modern" Hegel critique, 7). That is to say, Crockett and Davis reject the attempt to read Hegel off the history of post-Hegelian philosophy on the ground of the totalizing, violent effect of Hegel's idea of mediation and reconciliation of contradiction.

By contrast, the editors propose to view Hegel as the philosopher whose thought implies "true risk" and "gives us hope" (6). Following Žižek, their crucial idea is that Hegel's "absolute knowledge" indicates the position that accepts the instability of contradiction as internal to every claim of identity. As Žižek maintains, Hegelian "reconciliation" is not "a pan-logicist sublation of all reality in the Concept but an affirmation of the fact that the Concept itself is 'not all'" (6). Now this view is proposed as the central inspiration of this volume. Its eleven contributors are summoned to open up a debate on "which Hegel is most viable for our time" (6). Although the contributors offer different, more or less critical perspectives on Hegel, Žižek's and Derrida's readings of Hegel remain a common denominator. Ultimately, the Hegel to whom the majority of the authors continue to go back is Derrida's Hegel corrected through Žižek. The topic on which Hegel is tested is the intersection of religion and theology (but also art and literature) and politics -- an intersection that is often summarized in the dialectic relation of the finite and the infinite. It is here that the contemporary relevance of Hegel's reflection (of his alleged metaphysics and of his thought's relation to the political world) bears its fruit. Let me now briefly appraise each of the volume 's essays.

Working in the aftermath of Derrida's reflection on forgiveness, Catherine Malabou, in "Is Confession the Accomplishment of Recognition? Rousseau and the Unthought of Religion in the Phenomenology of Spirit," draws to the center the issue of the confrontation of religion and politics in the last steps of Hegel's 1807 work. The question, "is confession the accomplishment of recognition?" (19) is indicated as the central "political" question that traverses the Phenomenology. Recently, the topic of forgiveness has indeed attracted a lot of scholarly interest. Malabou connects that central question to the "political contradiction" that Hegel, in her view, sees incarnated in the duality of Rousseau the author of The Social Contract and Rousseau the author of The Confessions. At the center is, yet again, the issue of "recognition" -- recognition in the duplicity of its institutionalized forms, the contract and the literary work; recognition thematized through the language in which it is sought. The Phenomenology seems to suggest that the political "aporia" or contradiction left open by Rousseau finds its resolution only in religious confession or, more generally, in religion (as the last step before the ascent to "Absolute Knowing"). Yet, according to Hegel, it is both recognition and confession that have to uncover and expose their hidden religious meaning in order to acquire their higher speculative significance ("Absolute Knowing" as the conclusion of the Phenomenology).

In "Rereading Hegel: The Philosopher of Right," Antonio Negri offers an attack on Hegel's 1821 work that is as flashy as it is gratuitous. What we have here is the example of a certain "political" use of a Hegel that is not the historical Hegel who speaks in his own texts -- a use that is only for the sake of promoting the interpreter's own political theory, in this case Negri's idea of political emancipation. Such uses of Hegel are utterly useless. They bring nothing to the understanding of Hegel's own philosophy (how many times have we heard that Hegel posits the State as the highest ethical reality? The claim that labor is always labor for and of the State reveals a fundamental incomprehension of Hegel's complex understanding of the nature of civil society; see the way in which the crucial R§187 Remark on the function of Bildung in civil society is used entirely out of context at 32f.) and brings nothing to the serious intention of thinking with Hegel on contemporary political problems. In other words, it is not clear that Negri needs to refer to Hegel at all in order to present his own political ideas.

In "The Perversity of the Absolute, the Perverse Core of Hegel, and the Possibility of Radical Theology," John Caputo uses his critique of Hegel (and overall a Žižekian and Derridian inspiration) in order to tease out of Hegel's non-metaphysical theology the possibility of a radical theology, i.e., of a theology that is "bold enough" as to "pull up" the "venerable root" of the two-worlds assumption on which all traditional theology is inexorably based (47). Radical theology, in turn, allegedly leads to a radical politics (as a certain theologism is more or less hidden at work in all politics). But why "perversion"? We find that presenting Hegel "as a hero of 'perversatility'" is only another way to speak of "paradigm shift" -- a shift or indeed a "perversion" in the way in which the absolute is conceived.

Hegel's philosophy of religion and his view of Christianity as the consummate religion is at the center of Thomas Lewis's "Finite Representation, Spontaneous Thought, and the Politics of an Open-Ended Consummation." While reacting, like many of the authors in this volume, to the idea of a totalizing Hegel, Lewis turns to a different constellation of interpretations, namely, to Pippin and Pinkard, in order to stress the social component of Hegel's thinking of religion.

Bruno Bosteels's title, "Hegel in America," wants to sound like "Tintin in America not to mention Tintin in the Congo" and wants to evoke the same "incongruence" (67). But it also sounds like one of Ortega y Gasset's essays, one in which the Spanish philosopher exposes the limits of Hegel's idea of history. In this essay, which is an interesting contribution to the history of Hegel's reception, Hegel's thought is expanded into new geographical, cultural, and intellectual connections. While Hegel reads the future of America in his Lectures on the Philosophy of History, Bosteels looks at Hegel "from the vantage point of Latin America" (71), as well as through the Spanish writer Ortega y Gasset and through the Latin American writer Jose Revueltas (the short story "Hegel and I"). Significantly, at the center is neither Hegel's Logic nor his metaphysics but his philosophy of history. Radical politics come to the fore here as well as does the idea of infinity.

The juxtaposition of the Phenomenology and literary texts is at the center of Katrin Pahl's "The Way of Despair" (this time the literary text is The Passion According to G.H. by Clarice Lispector), which offers an interpretation of spirit's "way of despair" that combines a reflection on animal transformation, eating (145f.), and dismembering with the Christian Stations of the Cross and the Eleusinian mysteries.

A materialistic (and naturalistic) reading of Hegel that touches on issues of embodiment is offered by Adrian Johnston ("The Weakness of Nature: Hegel, Freud, Lacan, and Negativity Materialized") in a psychoanalytic vein that combines Freud, Lacan, and Žižek.

Mark Taylor brings his reading of Hegel to bear on the assessment of the central predicament of our globalized world and globalized politics, namely, the fragmentation of sectarianism. In his view, as totalitarianism is no longer the chief threat to our world, we should also cease to set Hegel's philosophy in connection with totalitarian politics. Taylor sees instead in Hegel's idea of dialectical mediation and of "identity-within-difference" an important resource to counter the contemporary threat of unbridgeable sectarianism. In "Infinite Restlesness" (the title hinting at Nancy's Hegel: The Restlessness of the Infinite), Taylor makes his point by leading us through an all-too-quick tour of the development of philosophy in Kant through the third Critique to post-Kantianism and the Jena Romantics up to Hegel (but also beyond, to Nietzsche and Nancy). Ultimately, aesthetics and art are the realms in which the "infinite restlessness" that connects the finite and the infinite (i.e., Hegel's peculiar brand of identity-within-difference) finds its place. Here Taylor's essay comes close to the topic covered by Edith Wyschogrod in "Disrupting Reason: Art and Madness in Hegel and Van Gogh" (which brings together Hegel's view of insanity and derangement in the Anthropology and the Lectures on Aesthetics).

A reading of the dialectic of the infinite and the finite, this time in a theological instead of aesthetic perspective, is also at the center of William Desmond's essay "Between Finitude and Infinity: On Hegel's Sublationary Infinitism." Desmond's critical proposal against what he calls Hegel's "sublationary infinitism," i.e., against the completely circular and symmetrical resolution of the finite in the infinite, is the idea of a "metaxological agapeics," i.e., the idea of the asymmetrical, open, imbalanced relation between the two (134ff.). Desmond's question is whether sublation can be reversed, i.e., whether we can move "from preserving to surpassing to negating" instead of "from negating to surpassing to preserving" (125). But does the question really make sense given the circular directionality of Hegel's dialectical method? Isn't Hegelian sublation (just as Hegelian negation) always bi-directional (see the movement of the "absolute method" that for Hegel is both the backward-looking retreat into the ground and the forward-looking advance in the determination process)? The essay offers the example of an interpreter who, working with the crucial terms of Hegel's dialectic, attempts to think beyond it. It remains an open question how successful such an attempt is beyond the inauguration of new technical expressions. Finally, Žižek's "Hegel and Shitting: The Idea's Constipation" is a virtuoso piece of provocation for a more traditional Hegel scholar as myself. But I'm sure will inspire many.

All in all, this volume is more interesting as a sign of our own times, for better and for worse, than as a contribution to Hegel scholarship. As a sign of our times for better, the volume presents the fruitful appropriation of Hegel's thought by a broad array of philosophical interests and voices. As a sign of our times for worse, it bears witness to the readership's need to be stimulated "over the top" in order to become interested. Accordingly, Hegel is seen as a contemporary if (and only if?) we can insert him in tickling constellations in which perversion, constipation, dismemberment, and the like have a place. From this operation we do indeed discover something about ourselves -- post-postmodern readers. But I doubt that we gain some deeper understanding of Hegel's thought.