Hegel and the Metaphysical Frontiers of Political Theory

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Eric Lee Goodfield, Hegel and the Metaphysical Frontiers of Political Theory, Routledge, 2014, 251pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415698474.

Reviewed by Mark Tunick, Florida Atlantic University


Eric Lee Goodfield takes a position in what has become a lively debate between those who insist we cannot truly appreciate Hegel's political philosophy unless we see how it is inextricably connected to Hegel's metaphysics as articulated in Hegel's Logic, and those who insist that we can fruitfully study Hegel's political philosophy and apply it to contemporary issues of public affairs by dislodging his political theory from that metaphysics. Goodfield defends the former position. His book goes beyond existing defenses of that position by providing a more extensive treatment of Hegel's logic and by attempting to link the position that we should abjure appeals to metaphysics to what he calls the 'liberal-positivist school' of political science. Goodfield devotes many pages to arguing against the 'descriptivist' view that Hegel's political theory is divorced from his metaphysics.

But for me the far more interesting and significant question that Goodfield takes up has to do with what he calls the 'prescriptivist' view. Prescriptivists, like myself, argue that regardless of Hegel's intentions, we ought to understand his political philosophy in a way that does not rely on commitment to his metaphysics. After reading all that Goodfield has to say against that position, I remain convinced that if we are plausibly to bring Hegel to bear on contemporary political issues, we must understand him without relying on his metaphysics. (Below I shall try to be a little more concrete about what it means for an argument to rely on a metaphysics, but to adequately address the issues Goodfield raises would require a far more rigorous inquiry into what this means.) So not surprisingly, I have some issues with Goodfield's argument; however, I want to emphasize that he deserves to be commended for laying out the controversy so starkly and pointing to a deeper issue about the role of metaphysics in political theory that is of concern to a wider audience than students of Hegel.

Goodfield is properly critical of the descriptivist position, which denies that Hegel intended to link political theory to metaphysics (75). He is right to insist that Hegel's metaphysics plays a crucial role in his justifications of key political institutions. But some of his targets, such as Allen Wood, do not deny that Hegel intended to rely on a metaphysics to ground many of his claims about the state and our freedom in it. They argue there is still value in studying Hegel's political theory without linking it to Hegel's logic. Even Goodfield at one point -- though in a footnote -- dismisses the linkage between some of Hegel's politically relevant judgments and Hegel's logic, saying "there seems no 'logical necessity' behind Hegel's gender ascriptions [that men are powerful and active, women are passive and subjective]" (214 n.50). But Goodfield's targets go further, insisting that even when we bracket the logic there is value in studying not only what Goodfield might regard as Hegel's side remarks, but Hegel's claims about core practices such as punishment, contracts and promises, property, monogamous marriage, and hereditary monarchy, practices for which Hegel undeniably intends to provide a metaphysical justification. Goodfield has a problem with this position and rejects the prescriptivist view.

One can be a prescriptivist without being a descriptivist. One can think that we should study Hegel's Philosophy of Right while bracketing its metaphysical moorings, without holding that Hegel himself would have been willing to do this. As Goodfield recognizes at one point, this is the position I have taken in arguing that in order to bring Hegel's Philosophy of Right to bear on our own practices and politics we need to modify or rehabilitate him (89; and Tunick, 12-23). Though this will mean departing from Hegel's own intentions, it may be necessary if we seek to cull justificatory arguments that do not rest on a metaphysics we cannot accept; "insofar as we intend to represent Hegel" (222), prescriptivists ought to acknowledge that they are modifying Hegel.

The question then remains, is the position of appropriating ideas and arguments that we find in Hegel's Philosophy of Right while rejecting their metaphysical moorings illegitimate or troubling?

Goodfield insists that we do a disservice to Hegel by detaching his political theory from his metaphysics. Given the effort he put into writing this and other works about Hegel, I presume he thinks that Hegel is worth studying carefully, knowing quite well what a large undertaking such study involves. Yet Goodfield himself is unwilling to commit to Hegel's metaphysics. He emphasizes that the chapters in which he addresses Hegel's metaphysical theme and its role in Hegel's political thought "is not taken up in defense of Hegel's teleological metaphysics of the spirit" (2). He says his account is "far from providing a defense of Hegel's metaphysical system" (5), and he seems unwilling to provide such a defense (7). Rather, he wants to make a broader claim that metaphysical concerns and frameworks are "redeemable and useful" (7). But what is useful about a framework one is unwilling to accept?

Goodfield's main target seems to be interpreters of Hegel's political theory who take Hegel as too liberal and not communitarian enough, though he also takes aim at those who take Hegel as too conservative. (I was surprised to see that Goodfield apparently associates me with the conservative interpreters who take Hegel's famous dictum that the 'rational is actual' to mean that all that exists is rational and there is no need for criticism (89, "conflation") even though the entire thrust of my work has been to argue that Hegel is an immanent critic, and I devote many pages to noting how Hegel distinguishes the actual and existence (see Tunick, pp. 152-67).) Goodfield asserts that we "inevitably get Hegel's political conclusions wrong in missing out on his program of logico-political synergy" (206). I think he is right in saying that one of his main targets, Wood, misses out on key features of Hegel's theory of punishment. Wood neglects how wrongs can involve more than just the violation of abstract rights and gives an overly 'atomistic' reading of Hegel, and so here may be an instance where someone who rejects the metaphysics gets Hegel wrong (p. 208). But this is not at all inevitable, and Wood's accounts of several other aspects of Hegel's political thought are quite persuasive.

More generally, Goodfield associates Hegel interpreters who want to put aside the metaphysics with realists like G. E. Moore and positive political scientists such as David Easton. He repeatedly implies that liberals and positivists are in union in making an assault against metaphysics (5, 48-9, 55, 75, 229). Positivists like Easton dismiss the notion of free will, and apparently Goodfield believes that those who dismiss the metaphysics of Hegel do the same (p. 55). Goodfield is critical of these liberal positivists for failing to recognize "Hegel's organicist thought" (210). I am not sure any significant Hegel interpreters do this; even Wood recognizes how for Hegel an individual is free only by being part of an organized whole that Hegel refers to as our system of ethical life (Sittlichkeit). But in any case, we will naturally be led to the question of what justifies favoring the state over an individual when rights conflict. Is it a metaphysical argument of the sort Hegel intends to give? Or is it a vision of the state as an organic whole? We can discern the latter in Hegel's texts and find value in that vision without assenting to a logic that even Goodfield is unwilling to endorse. Goodfield never defines 'metaphysics', though at one point he associates it with an account of the "meaning of human life" (63). Hegel's political theory offers such an account. There are interpreters of Locke who draw on Locke's vision of man in a state of nature, which is the basis for his justification of a state that respects individual rights, recognizing that Locke himself supported this vision with an appeal to God that might be unacceptable to many people today, but who nevertheless offer a Lockean theory that does not command an acceptance of its theological mooring. Similarly, one can draw on Hegel's vision of an organic state in which individuals find their meaning and even draw on it in making political arguments concerning institutions like punishment, property, or marriage without having to appeal to the logical mooring Hegel gives to this vision.

I think we must be nonfoundationalists at least when doing political theory as a normative enterprise that attempts to justify laws, practices, and institutions. Of course normative theory about how we ought to live cannot ignore empirical accounts of how we and the world in fact operate. But normative and empirical political theorists tend to focus on different sorts of questions. The test of success for an empirical political theory is whether it explains, predicts, or is in some sense true. The test of a normative political theory is whether it persuades; and if we endorse liberal pluralism it will not do for me to try to justify a practice to you by appealing to foundations that are not persuasive to you. I take the paradigmatic expression of liberal pluralism to be John Rawls's development of the idea of an 'overlapping consensus' (Rawls), with earlier roots in Isaiah Berlin's essay on J. S. Mill (Berlin, 218-251). The idea is that in a liberal society we cannot impose our own comprehensive doctrine on those who do not share it -- we cannot rightly justify a practice that will potentially make coercive demands on our fellow citizens by appealing to a particular religious or metaphysical doctrine that they may not share. For example, we cannot expect or insist that our fellow citizens accept institutions such as hereditary monarchy, monogamous marriage, private property, or punishment on the ground that these institutions are justified by Hegelian metaphysics, for that would be to impose a comprehensive doctrine on them that they might not accept. Goodfield, as I noted above, is unwilling to endorse Hegel's logic, so I would not imagine he would accept such a justification either. But a pluralist can, without assenting to Hegel's logic, argue that Hegel's organicist thought is attractive, tied to a compelling vision of the past linked to the present and future, of each individual having value by contributing to a system of ethical life in which each is recognized and has a home -- a 'metaphysical' conception in the sense that it is an account of the meaning of life -- and draw on this vision in trying to persuade us that we should accept the political institutions that Hegel defends. However the pluralist cannot ground this vision in a religious or metaphysical conception that commands our assent.

Goodfield argues at one point, in reference to 'empirical political theory', which he does not explicitly distinguish from a normative theory, that a "foundationless" political theory denies commitment to any metaphysics but really remains metaphysical (227-28). He explains: a view that proscribes metaphysics from debate is "tantamount to cancellations of truth as a possibility -- a position which itself entails a strong metaphysical claim and closure" (232). In effect he accuses the liberal positivists who reject metaphysics of unconsciously having a metaphysics that holds that there are no truths, and wonders how liberal positivists, whom he equates with liberal pluralists, would ever want to consult Hegel, who would so adamantly criticize the view that there are no truths. To answer him, I think we can say that liberal pluralists like Rawls need not deny truth as a possibility; they simply recognize that politics is a distinct activity that should accommodate people adhering to different comprehensive doctrines to the end of living together in peace, and believe that this requires that we agree to certain rules of engagement.

Another reason for hesitating to rely on Hegel's logic in making sense of his justifications of political institutions is the difficulty of understanding his metaphysics. Hegel is largely to blame for using obscure jargon, although in his lectures he showed he could express himself in language that was accessible and even moving (Tunick, 4-11). Goodfield's explication of Hegel's metaphysics can at times be difficult to make sense of, and even the patient reader may get frustrated with sentences such as "the . . . unity . . . witnesses Hegel's logical program" (186), "web . . . weaves . . . fabric" (183), "immediacy . . . is contained in the concept" (180) ,"issues . . . juxtapose . . . theorization . . . with . . . questions" (235), or "Hegel elaborated . . . ideas . . . in reflection of . . . concepts"(179). One reason that commentators such as Wood and Z. A. Pelczynski say they need not focus on Hegel's metaphysics in understanding the political philosophy is that they recognize that for all but a small number of devotees, the Logic is obscure. Goodfield follows Thom Brooks in responding that we should not care about the "size of our audience" (89). But we need to question that response when we are talking about the value of a work of political theory. There is a difference between normative political theory and disciplines such as quantum physics, neuroscience, mechanical engineering, and even microeconomics or social psychology. Political theory will be irrelevant unless it can be spoken in a language that can be understood by political actors, and we are all potentially political actors insofar as we are asked to obey laws and we have opinions on matters of public affair. It matters not one whit whether most people understand how to keep a bridge from crumbling during an earthquake, or how drugs interact with the brain, so long as a small subset of people do -- but it matters a great deal whether many people could understand what we say when we are engaged in politics and public affairs.

Goodfield says that an advantage of his view is that it will promote "vibrancy of debate" (230), but I am not so sure. Those who would take Hegel's logic as a justification for adopting practices and institutions will at some point be forced to say to their opponents, "you just don't understand", and that shuts off debate. This is a concern I have that I believe is shared by several other interpreters such as Wood, Pelczynski, and Michael Hardimon. It is not that we should distort Hegel to be popular -- descriptivists but not prescriptivists risk doing that; it is that we should adapt Hegel so he can have relevance and value as a political theorist, and so studies of Hegel's Philosophy of Right can be more than an intellectual exercise. Goodfield himself agrees that Hegel intended to "return to the public 'cave'" (109).

Goodfield characterizes the non-metaphysical Hegel as "bland" (201). I think there is a non-metaphysical way of understanding his theory of the modern state that is not bland and that helps us think through the problems we face as individuals and societies who struggle with the problem of existence. If Hegel's political philosophy cannot do this, why take the time to study it?

Berlin, Isaiah (2002): Liberty: Incorporating Four Essays on Liberty, Oxford University Press.

Rawls, John (1987): 'The Idea of an Overlapping Consensus', Oxford Journal of Legal Studies 7(1): 1-25.

Tunick, Mark (1992): Hegel's Political Philosophy, Princeton University Press.