Hegel and the Metaphysics of Absolute Negativity

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Brady Bowman, Hegel and the Metaphysics of Absolute Negativity, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 280pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107033597.

Reviewed by Dean Moyar, Johns Hopkins University


Readers of Hegel, especially those not content to remain within his own vocabulary, have long struggled with how to make sense of the activity that he attributes to such terms as 'essence', 'spirit', and the 'Concept'. Here's a prominent example of Hegel's use of such an active term: "The true is the whole. However, the whole is only the essence completing itself through its own development."[1] Hegel doesn't exactly shy away from using theological terms, so there is a natural way to read the activities as the workings of a neo-Platonic divine mind (the very need to capitalize Concept to mark its singularity suggests a super-agent at work behind our ordinary concepts). A turning point against such interpretations came with Robert Pippin's Hegel's Idealism,[2] which put at the forefront the Kantian dimension of Hegel's theoretical philosophy and opened a way to reading Hegel's active verbs as part of a logic in which the incompleteness of a certain concept generates new conditions, new concepts, through an internal dynamic aimed at the determinacy of the objective world. On this reading Hegel largely accepted Kant's critique of rationalist metaphysics, and thus couldn't possibly be a traditional metaphysician himself. Pippin showed how Hegel's project of constituting the world through logic could be read as an attempt to demonstrate that the conditions of the possibility of our thinking of objects are the conditions of the possibility of the objects themselves.

The past decade has seen something of a counterrevolutionary wave of interpretive work seeking to push back against the anti-metaphysical thrust of Pippin's reading. In part such readings are based on the worry that without a metaphysical logic, set apart from the vagaries of ordinary judgment and the social processes of recognition (a theme that Pippin has tied directly into his account of the idealism), the rigor of Hegel's systematic thought is compromised. A more external ground for this counter-movement is that the non-metaphysical reading seems to be driven by the assumption that Hegel would be more appealing to mainstream analytically-oriented philosophy if his metaphysical commitments were minimized (on this line Pippin is cast as doing for/to Hegel what P. F. Strawson did for/to Kant). Even if we assume that making Hegel more plausible to a wider audience is one of our goals, that goal seems no longer to be well-served by arguing against metaphysics. Analytic philosophy has become much more open to metaphysics over the last two decades, giving a new impetus to interpretive work that highlights Hegel's positive contribution to the metaphysical tradition.

Brady Bowman frames his account as part of this pro-metaphysical counter-wave (2-4, 258-59). His excellent book represents a major contribution to the project of reestablishing Hegel's metaphysical credentials, and it deserves close study by anyone engaged with Hegel's theoretical philosophy. It is part of the boldness of Bowman's project that rather than shying away from the active logical concepts, he builds his entire account around them. While taking Hegel's Kantianism seriously, Bowman's argument pays equal attention to the agenda set by Spinoza, and by F. H. Jacobi's critical reading of Spinoza. Bowman does not attempt to tame Hegel's thought for consumption by a wider audience, instead emphasizing that "Hegel's own speculative metaphysics is emphatically revisionary" (7). A major worry with such a heavily metaphysical approach is that the account will remain too close to Hegel's terminology to add anything philosophically new to our understanding of his texts. But Bowman brings a rich constellation of extra-Hegelian concepts to the project and manages thereby to avoid the overly textual brand of hermeticism. The ambition of the account, and its complexity, comes out in the following description:

Prior to ontology is a deeper metaphysical account of negativity designed to explain both the emergence of a finite cognitive mind that finds itself over against a categoriallystructured world of finite things, and the specific limits finite cognition encounters in trying to render that world intelligible to itself. Ultimately, the structure of the Concept and the dynamic of absolute negation serve to integrate the two great models from which post-Kantian philosophers drew their inspiration: Spinoza's monism and Kant's idealism. They do so by supporting a unified account of the source of determinacy in nature and intentionality, that is, by identifying a single structure that is at once the structure of being and the structure of thought. (23-24)

While structural readings of Hegel have become almost the norm (for metaphysical and non-metaphysical readings), Bowman goes further in arguing for an original activity that accounts for the structure of both nature and our thought. This argument leads to the conclusion that "knowledge of the truth is necessitated by the truth" (240), an idea that he likens to David Armstrong's recent theory of truth (240n2).

One of the great virtues of Bowman's book is that his interpretive agenda does not blind him to the nuances and complications of Hegel's position. Even in his opposition to the "non-metaphysical" Hegel, Bowman does not neglect those aspects of Hegel's view that clearly are directed against the metaphysical tradition. Just when I would find myself thinking the interpretation was one-sided, he would introduce complexities that demonstrate his grasp of the alternatives. Bowman is also keenly aware of the communicative perils of Hegel interpretation ("Some reader are sure to find observations like this akin to numerology and about as meaningful" (173); "One has to be very careful in expressing this relation since at this level of abstraction it is easy to stray into nonsense." (209)), but he does not shy away from difficulty. He builds on the work of previous commentators, but always discharges the burden of making the points intelligible in his own voice.

There is no way I can do justice even in summary to Bowman's many complex arguments. In what follows I will outline the main theses of four (out of seven) of Bowman's chapters, and then follow with some lines of resistance to those theses.

In his opening chapter Bowman draws on the work of two preeminent German commentators on Hegel's theoretical philosophy, Dieter Henrich and Rolf-Peter Horstmann, in order to establish the basic parameters of Hegel's relational metaphysics. From Horstmann he adopts an understanding of the Concept as a basic relational structure: "The unique character of the Concept lies in its being constituted wholly by relations which themselves are metaphysically prior to any relata that might appear to realize those relations" (37). While this suggests an inactive, perhaps overly formal structure, Bowman ties it together with Henrich's analysis of negation in order to explain the active process that gives rise to that structure. He writes that "the logic of absolute negativity" is "the generative dynamic that gives rise to the structure of the Concept" (48). This is "autonomous negation" because Hegel "ceases to view it as fundamentally standing in complementary correlation to affirmation" (50). According to this idea, negation can be (indeed must be) applied to itself, and in the process it generates an internal structure of identity and difference. In the following, Bowman describes a potential problem with this idea, and its solution:

Qua self-relating negation, autonomous negation immediately gives rise to a positive term (affirmation, being) to which it stands in an external relation, that is, a relation-to-other. . . . The decisive move, therefore, in reconstructing Hegel's Grundoperation is to posit relation-to-other as a moment wholly internal to the relation-to-self: the relation-to-other that emerges as an analytic implication of autonomous negation has to be interpreted as, in truth, the relation of autonomous negation to itself. (52)

Bowman is aware that many readers of Hegel will be much more familiar with "determinate negation" than with this conception of "absolute negativity," and he therefore emphasizes that determinate negation presupposes absolute negativity (55). Rather than determinate negation being the fundamental tool, it is "the moment of relation-to-other when conceived as the result of self-referential negation" (55).

Absolute negativity takes a back seat for much of the next four chapters, as Bowman delves into the specific criticisms of pre-Kantian metaphysics and the domains of "finite cognition." I pass over the masterful Chapter Two account of Hegel's critique of the metaphysics of both the classical rationalists and Kant himself. In Chapter Three Bowman examines Pippin's idealist reading and McDowell's more realist interpretation, and offers a characterization of Hegel's metaphysical position as one that is fundamentally skeptical about finite objects. Drawing on Robert Stern's work, Bowman notes that Pippin's claim that Hegel denies "any sense to a mind-world dichotomy" (109) renders untenable Pippin's view that self-consciousness is central to Hegel's project. The problem is that Pippin sometimes characterizes his Kantian view as anti-realist, and thus he seems to view Hegel's philosophy to be "an exploration of how we as self-conscious cognizers must take the world to be, not how the world really is" (109). While Bowman admits that many of Hegel's criticisms of Kant are compatible with the idea that Hegel is completing Kant's project, he ultimately thinks that the distance between Kant's fundamentally epistemological critical project and Hegel's metaphysical project is too great for Pippin's view to be correct. Bowman partially endorses McDowell's more realist appraisal of Hegel, but claims that McDowell only appreciates half of Hegel's position on finite objects, namely the epistemological side. What McDowell doesn't appreciate is:

Hegel's metaphysical idealism: the position that the whole sphere of categorically constituted, finite objectivity is both independent of finite cognizers and radically dependent on an infinite ground that does not itself in turn fall under the categories, but is the activity of which they are manifestations. (115)

Thus McDowell and Pippin are both guilty of focusing on the reality of "determinate objects," a focus that "makes thought beholden to a class of objects that are finite, merely phenomenal, and hence ultimately unreal" (124). Bowman takes this to imply that Hegel is "a radical skeptic" (126) about what we ordinarily call knowledge. In Chapter Four Bowman applies this skeptical interpretation to Hegel's understanding of nature, and argues "that even items such as Galileo's law of free fall do not fully count as knowledge in the sense relevant for Hegel" (136). He emphasizes the transformational and revisionary aspects of Hegel's approach, whereby we come to see the objects of natural science, and natural science itself, as incapable of full justification on their own terms.

The interpretation really comes to a head in Chapter 5, where Bowman argues that Jacobi's criticism of Spinoza could be seen as a serious criticism of Hegel's relational metaphysics as well (I am leaving out here Bowman's strikingly original use of Hegel's views on geometry to stage the argument). He does an excellent job of showing that Hegel's own sympathy with Jacobi's critique (that Spinozism leads to a formalism of relations that implies fatalism and nihilism) risks making his own position internally contradictory. While repeating much of Jacobi's critique, Hegel "himself espouses a metaphysics that is explicitly committed to the absolutely relational view of finite things" (159). Here is Bowman on Jacobi's criticism and the Hegelian position that seems to be guilty of the very same sins as Spinozism:

Jacobi alleges that (1) the essential role of tautologies ("identical propositions") in demonstrative reasoning, (2) the primacy of relations over intrinsic properties or qualities, and (3) the closely related primacy of the whole over the parts (semantic and especially metaphysical holism) are what entail fatalism and nihilism. And excepting (1), these are among the most striking features of Hegel's own system, which I think is best understood as a version of metaphysical structural realism. The very concept of the Concept is that of a complex of nested relations that are absolutely prior to any (by definition finite) relata. The concept of absolute negativity is that of a self-referring procedure or process that originates the elements through whose relations it manifests itself, thereby also individuating itself as the singulare tantum it is. And the Hegelian absolute . . . is by definition the whole, while the various individualities populating Hegelian science are moments that can claim neither determinateness nor existence outside that whole. (166-67)

To show how Hegel escapes Jacobi's critique, Bowman analyzes a long passage in which Hegel accuses Jacobi of viewing mediation and holism only from the perspective of finitude, and thus of opposing immediacy to mediation in a dogmatic way. The question then is how to save the finite things on the absolute relationally view, for Hegel clearly sympathizes with Jacobi's complaint against Spinoza that finite individuals fall out of a systematic rationalist view. Bowman thus insists that Hegel does find a place for the finite:

Finite cognition is a constitutive moment of the (infinite) cognition of the Idea, and reference to finite, self-external, non-absolute objects of knowledge is thus an ineliminable, albeit subordinate and by nature evanescent moment of the Idea's self-cognition. . . . Its constitutive character is to be vanishing, not to be nothing. (189)

It is this moment of finitude that enables Hegel to answer Jacobi's formalism charge and thus to escape the charge of "acosmism" that he levels against Spinoza.

The penultimate chapter argues for an interpretation of Hegel's conception of logical content, which Bowman views as the answer to the fundamental problems that Hegel diagnosed in Spinoza and Kant. Bowman views as "strictly analogous" (201) the problems of how to account for the relation between Kant's transcendental I and the sensible manifold, on the one hand, and for Spinoza's relation between substance and the finite modes of cognition, on the other. To sort out these problems and Hegel's unitary solution, Bowman has recourse to a scholastic and Cartesian distinction, namely the distinction between formal and objective reality. With the help of this distinction he attempts to make intelligible Hegel's goal of uniting substance and subject. In Bowman's reconstruction substance stands for the formal reality of a mind-independent world and objective reality stands for the intentional content of a subject's representation of objects. The discussion here is difficult but illuminating, as Bowman guides us through the dialectic of these two kinds of reality in their relation to each other. Pausing to take stock and reorient the reader, Bowman describes Hegel's "metaphysics of knowing" as follows:

One helpful way of looking at Hegelian speculative science is to see it as starting with a certain analysis of the "logic" of knowing (i.e. the "dialectical" identity of formal and objective reality presented above), and then positing it as a structure/dynamic absolutely prior to the subjective acts of knowing that make up finite cognition. (214)

Bowman thus aims to account for the reflexive dimension of Hegelian metaphysics, the way in which it has to account for its own possibility as a form of knowing. The language of positing is also central in the following conclusion: "all reality ("the true," "the absolute") depends on the emergence of a difference between formal and objective reality such that formal reality exists just to the extent that it is posited in and through its objective reality, in other words as an object of knowing" (218-19). The Hegel that emerges on this reading thus clearly subscribes to idealism, though a "non-psychological" idealism that is compatible with metaphysical structural realism.

I turn now to raise some questions about the argument. Bowman is surely right to identify negativity as the central figure in Hegel's thought, but there is reason to doubt that absolute negativity is an autonomous negation that constitutes an ultimate active ground. This is a complex issue, yet the potential problem is clear enough from Hegel's statement about first principles in the famous Preface to the Phenomenology of Spirit. As autonomous, it seems that absolute negativity is supposed to be a first principle, a ground from which everything else flows. Yet Hegel's holism means that he is opposed to all first principles:

It is only as a system that knowledge is actual and can be presented as science; and that any further so‑called fundamental proposition or first principle of philosophy, if it is true, is for this reason alone also false just because it is a fundamental proposition or a principle.[3]

The absolute negativity of reflection may well be Hegel's primary methodological tool, but as such a tool it does not seem to be autonomous in the sense of floating free from affirmation. As a principle of mediation, absolute negativity's main function is to turn immediate affirmations into more determinate affirmations.

Part of the point of Hegelian negation is the duality of the finite and infinite, the way in which they are two sides of a single coin. Bowman thus seems to go too far in demoting the status of finite objects and finite cognition when he writes that Hegel's position is "maximally strong version of skepticism" (102) about knowledge of finite objects and that this is an "unmitigated skepticism" (128). It seems essential to Hegel's view that his skepticism is moderate and indeed highly mitigated. The bulk of his writings concern finite objects and finite cognition, and the arrival at the "Absolute Idea," when according to Bowman we finally get beyond finite cognition, consists mainly of a discussion of the method by which the forms of finite cognition have been interpreted to form a systematic whole.

Bowman's more detailed descriptions of his position on the finite show a more balanced view, for he argues that the finite is transformed in our speculative knowledge of it (42). So the finite can be known and does find a place within Hegel's ultimate account of reality, but the finite loses the immediacy and independence that we naively attribute to it. The most direct admission of the positive role of the finite comes in his answer to Jacobi's charge that relational metaphysics loses all grasp of the finite. In that context, Bowman writes, "the perennial recurrence of a self-external, finite content . . . cannot vanish lest the foundation crumble on which the higher-level self-relation of philosophical cognition is built" (189). This seems basically right to me, except that it is rather confusing to call the finite the foundation of cognition, especially after calling Hegel a radical skeptic of the finite. The view of the finite as the "vanishing" also doesn't seem to capture the sense in which finite individuals can themselves be self-relating and therefore simultaneously infinite in Hegel's sense.

A further concern, closely related to the previous two, is that Bowman's account is oriented too much by Hegel's "Doctrine of Essence," and not enough by his "Doctrine of the Concept." There is reason to think that the discussion of negativity at the beginning of "Doctrine of Essence," the torturous section that is the basis of Henrich's view, is itself an abstraction from the genuinely reality-defining treatment of cognition and objectivity in the "Doctrine of the Concept." In the latter Hegel gives an account of forms of judgment followed by an account of forms of inference. The judgment-inference relation is perhaps the key to making sense of how the infinite (the inference as the form of reason) is built on the "foundation" of the finite (the judgment as the form of the understanding).[4] I also worry that by introducing formal and objective reality, and putting so much weight on metaphysical necessitation, Bowman has confined himself too much to concepts from the final section of the "Doctrine of Essence," at the expense of dealing more fully not only with the inference, but with mechanism, teleology and life. The latter two topics in particular would have helped show (along with the critical discussion of the geometric method) how much Hegel departs in the end from Spinoza's rationalism.

Bowman certainly does make a good case for Hegel's difference from Spinoza, but it is one that raises a number of further questions about the nature of Hegel's view. Answering the question of how Hegel reconceived the problematic relation in Spinoza of substance and its attributes, Bowman writes,

On the Hegelian conception, by contrast, the original determinateness of substance just is the existence of the intellect that finds itself outside (infinite) substance and therefore finite: in Hegel's technical terms, the determinateness of substance is identical to the existence of the understanding or finite cognition. (221)

The claim that the being (i.e., the "determinateness") of substance is finite cognition itself could be read as overcoming the very project of metaphysics rather than as an argument for metaphysics. It could be reformulated as the claim that the real is just what it can be known to be through finite cognition. Perhaps one could make the case that only a metaphysical argument could get us to this claim about the original determinacy of substance, but then I start wondering whether the self-negating character of such an argument (practice metaphysics in order to undermine the metaphysical separation of being and finite thought) is compatible with the kind of robust metaphysics that Bowman aims to establish. There is a different sense of metaphysics that would align it closely with semantics, a sense in which metaphysics is about ultimate intelligibility or sense-making. There are many points in Bowman's book where he does seem to align Hegel with this rather moderate understanding of metaphysics, which would be fine, except that such an understanding of Hegel is extremely close to Pippin's supposedly contrary Kantian view that conditions of intelligibility are the conditions of objectivity.

The proximity of the Hegelian metaphysics that Bowman defends to the Kantian view can also be made out through comparing the position to that of Fichte's Jena Wissenschaftslehre. There are several points where Bowman acknowledges the tight relation of Fichte's and Hegel's projects (3, 46, 189, 226), though he also notes several key differences. The project of a "metaphysics of knowing," in which one gives a logic of knowing and then posits that logic as the basis of the real (see Bowman's description quoted above from p. 214), seems quiteFichtean to me. Of course Hegel aimed to remove the lingering psychologistic element from Fichte's view, thus giving the dialectic of thinking a more purely conceptual expression, one that didn't have to insist on the priority of the subject against the real. Hegel stressed that his negation is immanent rather than external, and he aimed to integrate thought within nature by demonstrating nature's intelligibility, but Hegel's project still seems to be a closer cousin to Fichte's than to anyone else's. This affinity would be even more pronounced if Bowman had tried to account for the role of the practical at the end of Hegel's Science of Logic. Fichte ultimately relied on practical grounds for overcoming Spinoza's metaphysics, and though Hegel thought that a more immanent critique was possible, he too had recourse to the practical as essential to his very method.

But any well-focused book on Hegel has to leave many topics out of consideration. It is a mark of Bowman's achievement that one finishes his dense, challenging book wanting to read more.[5]

[1] G.W.F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, translated by Terry Pinkard, ¶20. Gesammelte Werke(GW), edited by the Academy of Sciences of Nordrhein-Westfalia (Hamburg: Meiner 1968- ), Vol. 9, p. 19.

[2] Robert Pippin, Hegel's Idealism: The Satisfactions of Self-consciousness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.

[3] Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, ¶24. GW 9, p. 24.

[4] I have in mind the following passage from The Science of Logic, where Hegel is answering the question of what makes non-finite objects rational: "the infinite in them is not the empty abstraction from the finite, is not a universality which is void of content and determination, but is the fulfilled universality . . . Only in this way does reason rise above the finite, the conditioned, the sensuous, or however one might define it, and is in this negativity essentially replete with content, for as unity it is the unity of determinate extremes. And so the rational is nothing but the inference [Schluß]." G.W.F. Hegel, The Science of Logic, translated by George di Giovanni. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2010, p. 589. GW 12, p. 91 (translation altered). Bowman comes close to thematizing Hegel's version of the judgment-inference difference in a discussion of the "speculative sentence" (251-54).

[5] I would like to thank Yitzhak Melamed for helpful comments on a draft of this review.