Hegel, Nietzsche, and Philosophy: Thinking Freedom

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Dudley, Will, Hegel, Nietzsche, and Philosophy: Thinking Freedom, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 344pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 052181250X.

Reviewed by Robert Williams, University of Illinois at Chicago


This book challenges the contemporary consensus that Hegel and Nietzsche are opposites. Gilles Deleuze, who helped to shape that consensus, believed that between Hegel and Nietzsche no compromise is possible. But there have been dissenters from this consensus, including Walter Kaufmann, Daniel Breazeale, Stanley Rosen, Elliot Jurist and Stephen Houlgate. Now Will Dudley weighs in with a fine study that perhaps can be added to the Kaufmann camp.

Dudley has produced well-researched and documented interpretations of two of the most difficult philosophers. He begins by situating Hegel and Nietzsche as critics of Kant. This is an important tactical move: by demonstrating a common philosophical opponent and by showing that they present similar criticisms of Kant’s position, Dudley demonstrates a possible convergence. According to Dudley, Hegel and Nietzsche both believe that Kant’s concept of moral will is formal and empty, and they identify different ways in which the Kantian conception of freedom must be modified and enlarged. He seeks to show that their responses are not opposite but complementary.

It is a commonplace that freedom is a central concept and motif in Hegel’s thought, but most studies of freedom tends to be confined to Hegel’s Philosophy of Right and Philosophy of History. In contrast to Allen Wood, who dismisses Hegel’s logic, Dudley believes that, without an understanding of the logic, Hegel’s position is not sufficiently appreciated or understood. Dudley begins with Hegel’s analysis of freedom in the Encyclopedia logic, which refers to Kant’s third antinomy of freedom versus necessity, but gives it a dialectical twist. Freedom is the “internalization” of externality so that things remain bound, but their being bound to each other is constitutive of what they are. The bonds are now understood to be internal to the nature of things so that each is what it is only by being part of a whole. Thus, freedom is necessity comprehended, posited and surpassed (aufgehoben). Although abstractly formulated, Hegel’s conception of freedom is a social infinite: to wit, a finite thing’s internalization of its connection to its other, and its recognition that it and its other are reciprocally constitutive produces genuine, rather than spurious, infinity. Freedom is a genuine infinite which consists in remaining at home with self in its other, or expressed as a process, of coming to self in its other. Being at home with self in other is a holistic conception of freedom which is embodied in Hegel’s account of ethical life and its institutions.

However, the social infinity of freedom is only partly realized in Hegel’s objective spirit. Put simply, the state, as the objective realization of the will in the world, does not exhaust Hegel’s conception of freedom. The state is an institution limited and opposed not only by other states but also by nature. This means that the full manifestation of freedom lies deeper (or higher) in absolute spirit, the sphere of art, religion and philosophy.

Dudley wishes to examine the Philosophy of Right from a logical point of view. But which logical category corresponds to the will and the point of view of morality? The general question concerning correspondences (or the lack thereof) between logical categories and real philosophical Gestalten has been debated without success or consensus. Some have maintained that the logic of essence underlies the philosophy of right. Dudley believes that the category of judgment corresponds to and grounds the account of the will. Common to both of these proposals is the issue of incomplete mediation, which means that spirit remains bound by and limited by another and consequently does not obtain its proper infinity. As Dudley shows, the copula, the “is”, of judgment, is an incomplete mediation because the terms S and P remain external to each other. Hence in the moral will, as in judgment, universality, particularity and individuality are both divided and held together, known to be different, but nevertheless assumed to be identical. The dualism or antinomy of the moral will shows that it is not the locus of freedom but is rather a perversion of it. Dudley concludes that it is the logical limitations of judgment that limit the moral will, that make it conceptually incapable of being the actuality of freedom. The moral will is always in the position of having to specify the content of the good, but is unable to do so. The moral will is a mere Schein, a hopelessly self-contradictory concept that conceives freedom in a way that makes freedom impossible. Dudley’s discussion is brilliant and far more complex and subtle than can be indicated in the space of a review.

However, while the logic of judgment undoubtedly casts a long ray of light on the problems of the moral will, it is far from clear that this category illumines or underlies the entire Philosophy of Right, including the institutions of ethical life. As Hegel shows in the logic, the double-sided middle term of syllogism replaces the copula of judgment, and syllogism completes the incomplete mediation of judgment. The institutions of ethical life are conceived organic totalities that reflect and embody richer logical categories such as syllogism, chemism and teleology. Dudley acknowledges that ethical life overcomes the abstract dualisms and antinomies of morality, but he does not provide an analysis of their categorical deep structure comparable to his analysis of judgment and moral will. This leads him to downplay and underestimate the elements of reconciliation recently stressed by Hardimon and others, not only in Hegel’s account of punishment but also in his account of ethical life. Dudley acknowledges that these reconciliations and mediations are present in the texts, but leaves them without foundation or clarification from the logic. It is not clear whether he believes that judgment underlies the entire objective spirit and Rechtsphilosophie or whether his account of its logical deep structures is simply incomplete.

This puzzle is deepened by the fact that Dudley discusses syllogism as the successor category to judgment. However, he correlates syllogism with absolute spirit. The reason for this narrow reading and application of syllogism is not evident. Dudley is correct that the objective spirit and institutions of ethical life remain finite, and that objective spirit and its institutions are surpassed by absolute spirit. However from this it does not follow that the mediating institutions of ethical life—punishment, marriage, corporations and state—are all hung up on the incomplete mediations of the category of judgment. If that were so, then there would be no reciprocal recognition, and no concept of spirit or ethical life and its leading institutions. These important mediating institutions are obscured if they are viewed simply through the lens of the logical category of judgment.

Dudley’s discussion of absolute spirit begins with the observation that the will, as the second, oppositional mode of the dialectic, remains limited by what it negates and thus cannot account for the unity of spirit and nature. Thus, Dudley believes that the subject cannot become truly infinite on the level of objective spirit and the level of will. The will, as the second, oppositional moment of the dialectic, has to be aufgehoben, and this occurs in the move to syllogism and purposiveness. The will depends on and presupposes another logical category in which the unification of the spiritual subject and natural world is always already the case prior to their being judged (divided) as independent. Such a unification is not achieved through willing, not forged by the subject, but is always already true in itself. (p. 90) Thus, the will presupposes this unification.

This reversal continues Hegel’s critique of Kant’s view that religion and theology are derivative from morality. Kant reduces the existence of God (what is true in itself) to a merely subjective postulate. This subjective form of the postulate contradicts its objective content. In maintaining that the true in itself is prior to will, Hegel reverses Kant’s order of dependence, and this reversal is Hegel’s version of the ontological argument and the transition to absolute spirit. It removes the illusion that the supreme good is not realized, or that it is dependent on the will for its realization. If the supreme good is always already realized, or eternally realizes itself, then the world is as it ought to be. With this realization the will lets go its striving and is overcome. This reversal is a higher realism, which embodies a higher form of freedom than the will, namely freedom on the level of absolute spirit.

Dudley seems unsure how to present this higher standpoint of absolute spirit. Is the final overcoming of the will somehow produced by willing? Does the will lift itself to absolute spirit by pulling up its own bootstraps? Or does it rather discover a presence and limit to its striving that is always already there, the sought-for eternally realized reconciliation—the good itself? Dudley seems to want to have it both ways. His suggestion, made in the concluding chapter, that truth at this level should be formulated in the middle voice, may point a methodological way out of one-sided dichotomies. But it leaves the substantial issue, the reversal inherent in the ontological argument, unclarified.

Dudley rehearses and defends the well-known Hegelian view that philosophy is the final arbiter of the truth of absolute spirit; this means that in his view philosophy is the ultimate form and shape of freedom. Dudley tells us that art and religion, like willing, are dependent for their content on something external to themselves. Philosophy, in contrast, depends for its content only on its own form, conceptual thought, and has no external other, and is not finite in either of the senses in which willing is (107). Hence, Dudley regards philosophy as absolute spirit because it overcomes the externality that persists in the images of art and the representations of religion.

If Hegel is philosopher of the system, Nietzsche is anti-system. But this does not mean that there is no order and organization to his thought, and one of the merits of Dudley’s reading is to bring out and express Nietzsche’s ordered concept of freedom. Dudley concedes that Nietzsche is not usually thought of as a philosopher of freedom. Indeed, it is not even clear that Nietzsche possesses a concept of freedom. However, Dudley proposes that Nietzsche’s account of freedom is implicit in his discussion of decadence, nobility and tragedy. So he engages in a hermeneutics and reconstruction of Nietzsche’s account of freedom. Dudley’s thesis is that the decadent (servile or herd morality), the noble and the tragic represents three stages of increasing degrees of freedom. He proposes to read these as stages of liberation. This not only reads Nietzsche against the grain of his elitism, but also brings him into proximity to Hegel.

Dudley distinguishes three ways in which, according to Nietzsche, humans can fail to be free. Two are types of decadence: 1) The peculiarly modern sickness arising after shedding the constraints of tradition and being open to everything, of being unable to forge an independent will, and thus being turned over to one’s instincts. 2) The premodern sickness of decadent herd morality, with its reactive willing that depends on an external stimulus (thus a form of heteronomy) and is accompanied by the ascetic ideal and the metaphysics of weakness. The third unfreedom is noble morality, which has forged an independent will but in a parochial way that excludes everything other and alien to its standards of measure; thus its measure is parochial, and the noble is limited by what it excludes. Consequently, even though it is more free than herd morality by virtue of its affirmative willing, it too remains a form of heteronomy.

Dudley’s account of herd morality and its accompanying metaphysics of weakness is illuminating. Too weak to forge a will of their own, decadents don’t act, but react to what they regard as the evil ones. Since their actions are reactive and negative, full of ressentiment, these very practices are a flight from the actual world towards an imaginary ideal world where there is no suffering. This imaginary world is the true world, and the actual world is devalued to the status of a mere distorted appearance of the true world, or finally devalued to nothing. The metaphysics of weakness arises on this soil of ressentiment and world-devaluation. Its leading concepts, the true versus the false worlds, the concept of God as moral lawgiver and judge, the immortal soul that confers equal moral worth on everyone, free will as a postulate to hold noble types accountable for their alleged injustice, all are part of a package: the moral vision of the world in which the actual world stands condemned. Since the metaphysics of weakness originates in ressentiment, its affirmations are fundamentally negative and empty. This is Nietzsche’s emptiness charge parallel to Hegel’s critique of morality as formalism.

Yet the metaphysics of weakness is also an attempt to forestall nihilism by saving the will and protecting against its own self-negation and inability to will. The aim of the metaphysics of weakness is to provide an interpretation of suffering and to hold out the hope of the end of suffering. The ascetic ideal holds that real life and real happiness are found only in the true world. Suffering is thus given an explanation. The metaphysics of weakness and its ascetic ideal are improvements over total nihilism: the willing of the void is better than no will at all. Thus, the will itself is saved and total nihilism is avoided.

This solution does not overcome decadence and weakness, nor is it the achievement of genuine freedom. The moral vision of the world succeeds in producing the herd morality, a cultural condition in which individuals lack independent wills but conform to the herd and its values. Individuals are reduced to being functions of the herd and herd values.

The moral will has to be overcome. Or rather, it overcomes itself: the moral commitment to truth undermines morality and its real world. The metaphysics of weakness is exposed as “lies”. The commitment to truth ultimately destroys the herd morality and leads to a displacement of the herd perspective. The true world where there is no suffering is disclosed as a lie. But in the aftermath of the death of God, how is it possible to forge a will without a ground, without an eternally valid perspective? How is it possible to forge a will apart from herd community and conformity? Yet an attempt to forge a will must be made, because the alternative is radical nihilism.

Nietzsche turns to the noble type, the opposite of decadence, and whose morality is a life affirming self-apotheosis. Its fundamental features, Dudley maintains, are its selfishness, its ability to be indifferent to the suffering of others, and its hardness, its willingness to reduce others to expendable slaves for the sake of its own affirmations. It is a creative, sovereign morality, according to which to forge a will is equivalent to becoming an independent individual and standing out as an exception to the herd. This independence is due to the sheer vitality and differential character of authentic self-affirmation. Thus the noble type leads to a radical, individualistic autonomy and the creation of plural noble moralities. There is no single moral code; no one-size fits all morality—as maintained by the herd.

Dudley suggests that noble moralities can be communicated and shared. However, noble cultures, to the extent that their moralities and values are shared and communal, are also herdlike. And to this extent they also fail to liberate their adherents from the herd, and rather reimpose herd aspects. For Nietzsche all community is common and herdlike. And because this is the case, Dudley argues that noble morality is not finally free, and its measure is parochial. Thus noble morality remains caught in its own measure and perspective. There is a higher freedom, namely, tragic freedom.

The tragedy-affirming Übermensch overcomes the noble, self-affirming will. On the one hand, there is a forgetting, a practice of oblivion in which the determinacy of the noble is forgotten, laid aside. Thus, the measure of the will is laid open to the otherness which it had previously excluded. The will becomes unsittliche, i.e., it is not attached to any customs---in contrast to both the herd and noble moralities. Only now is it able to become the free and changeable being that it is. In overcoming the noble type, the will is liberated, released from any measure that could define or be required by any stable community. (183) The result is a spiritual nomadism and experimentalism, in which the self adopts a particular set of values and convictions when they fit the situation or needs of the self, and eventually abandons these convictions because no set of convictions can contain or measure the self. (185) This nomadic experimentalism contradicts the basic tendency and will of spirit, its will to assimilate and grow, namely, the will to power. According to Dudley, Nietzsche’s final liberation involves the overcoming of the will to power.

Tragedy both acknowledges the necessary existence of pain and suffering and approves and consents to their existence. The tragic spirit takes pleasure in both creation and destruction. And so the tragic spirit is marked by the love of fate which requires that we must love what has been to the point where it justifies all that preceded it, while yet recognizing that all of our efforts will one day be undone. Eternal recurrence is a kind of tragic redemption in which the past—”all the it was”—is transformed into a “thus I willed it” which is a refusal of the condemnation of existence and rather a restoration of the innocence of becoming. Nietzsche’s view is a tragic, worldly, self-redemption. (207) Instead of redemption implying a separation of the true world from the actual world, tragic redemption proceeds from the recognition of the abyssal character of the world and the fact that there is no possible escape from it.

Dudley claims that tragic experience cannot be wholly private and individual, but must be shared, and it must develop a tragic culture. (216) The reason is that the tragic redemption of the past requires more than a single tragic individual, for a single individual cannot suffice to affirm the present in such a way to redeem the past even in Nietzsche’s sense of redemption. However, Dudley does not show how the sharing of tragic experience avoids degenerating into herd community.

Dudley’s book is really two relatively independent monographs expounding the themes of freedom in Hegel and Nietzsche. He argues that these philosophies are not incompatible: he wants to have both Hegel and Nietzsche. But how can this “and” be supported and justified? Dudley argues thus: he distinguishes universal categories (Hegel) from non-universal, non-categorical concepts (Nietzsche). Categories in Hegel’s sense are necessary to thought because they make possible all conceptual activity, including thinking via non-categorical concepts. The latter are not necessary to thought, but develop contingently out of mundane experience. This distinction allows Dudley to make the following proposal: the philosophical practices of Hegel and Nietzsche are compatible, because Hegel’s insistence that thought be self-determining applies to categories but not to non-categorical concepts, and Nietzsche’s insistence that systems of thought must be open to transgression and transformation can be understood as applying to non-categorical concepts but not to categories. This resolution is a two-level approach and requires reading Nietzsche against the grain of his skeptical position.

Dudley observes that Nietzsche is not quite sure whether categories are in fact exposed as bogus by genealogical critique, or only that they may be exposed as non-categorical, bogus universals. The Hegelian categories and system are certainly suspect; genealogy might be able to show that they are in fact non-categorical and subject to transgression and transformation. On the other hand, Dudley acknowledges that if Nietzsche’s project as he understands it were successful, genealogy would undermine the Hegelian system, and no reconciliation with Hegel would be possible. However Nietzsche has not made a serious study of Hegelian categories, nor has he dealt with the obvious self-referential problems in many of his skeptical and polemical pronouncements. Dudley proposes to combine the two positions, at least methodologically, so that the tensions between them may be put to creative use. But it is not clear how this combination could come off if Nietzsche and his followers reject categories in Hegel’s sense.

This is a dense, closely reasoned, textually documented book from which there is much to be learned. At the same time it calls for critical questions. The first is that the “and” in the title is underdeveloped. The question of substantive convergence is deferred to the final chapter. When the question of convergence is addressed, the focus is not on Hegel’s and Nietzsche’s substantial views of freedom, but rather on their philosophical methodologies of logic and of genealogy. The argument is that their philosophical methodologies are not necessarily incompatible. But this does not add up to substantial convergence on freedom.

Second, I noted above that Dudley fails to provide logical grounding for and downplays the logical significance of reconciliation in Hegel’s Rechtsphilosophie. Dudley passes over it completely in his discussion of the concept of the will in Philosophy of Right §§5-7, and presents an apparently individualist account of the will. He ignores Hegel’s example of friendship as the will’s being at home with itself in its other. If Dudley underestimates recognition as a form of reconciliation in Hegel, he may overestimate the possibilities of intersubjectivity and community in Nietzsche. Eliot Jurist and Murray Greene have claimed that Nietzsche has no equivalent to Hegel’s concept of recognition, and it would seem he has no affirmative conception of intersubjectivity. For Nietzsche all community is herd community. How then can noble values or tragic experience be properly and authentically communicated or shared?

Third, both Hegel and Nietzsche are interested in tragedy, but are both tragic thinkers? What is meant by tragedy? Is there a tragic liberation or redemption? Liberation appears to be a herd value. The decadent herd may long for liberation; however, liberation would seem to be something alien to the noble type, or to the tragedy-affirming Übermensch. For the noble type acts out of fullness, self-glorification and self-affirmation and would not experience a need for liberation. On the other hand, since ethical experimentalism accepts and affirms the tragic and eternal recurrence, it sees itself as liberated from the need for liberation and redemption.

The deeper issue is whether either liberation or reconciliation is possible within the tragic point of view or rather requires its Aufhebung. Following Ricoeur’s typology, tragedy identifies evil with finitude. Existence is flawed and finitude is the problem. Hence the conditions of finite freedom are at the same time the conditions of tragic conflict and destruction, and no redemption or reconciliation within the tragic can occur. That is why it is tragic.

Dudley observes that, in Nietzsche’s narratives, concepts such as redemption, whose ordinary use and genealogy are Biblical, continue to be used, but are deconstructed, turned on their heads, co-opted within a wholly new valuation. But this emptying redemption of Biblical content and replacing it with tragic content still leaves us with the question: if Nietzsche’s ultimate perspective is tragic eternal recurrence, and if Ricoeur is correct that the tragic identification of evil with finitude renders reconciliation and redemption within the tragic framework impossible, with what justification does Nietzsche, or can Dudley, speak of tragic redemption?

This book engages fundamental, difficult questions, and this is one of the best reasons for recommending it. It repays careful study and should be on the ‘must read’ list of everyone interested in Hegel and Nietzsche.