Hegel on Action

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Arto Laitinen and Constantine Sandis (eds.), Hegel on Action, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 320pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230229082.

Reviewed by Robert R. Williams, University of Illinois-Chicago


Hegel on Action is a second collection of essays on the topic. The first, Hegel's Philosophy of Action, appeared in 1983. Charles Taylor's influential essay, "Hegel and the Philosophy of Action," appears as the lead essay in both collections. In that essay, Taylor identifies action as an enduring, much debated topic in philosophy. He distinguishes two views: the causal, which interprets actions as physical movements with causes (psychological desires), and the qualitative, which claims actions are qualitatively different from physical movements, because actions are intrinsically directed, inhabited by the purposes that direct them. The former causal view he identifies with Donald Davidson, and finds its antecedents in seventeenth-century Cartesian and empiricist philosophies. The latter view he finds in Aristotle, Leibniz, and developed most fully by Kant, Fichte and Hegel.

According to Taylor, action implies agency; these taken together become the framework within which he unfolds the qualitative view. Self-knowledge is neither a priori nor an empirical given, but becomes available to the knower only qua agent, through his doing, through his purposive projects. Self-understanding is conceived as the inner self-reflection of a life process which at the outset fails to grasp what it is about. The agent learns through a painful, error-filled process to formulate himself less and less inadequately, and to overcome confused, inferior self-contradictory forms and practices. The goal of this self-correcting process of agency is that spirit comes to understand itself better, and its life process becomes transparent as an embodiment of this purpose.

The qualitative theory of action involves a reversal in the order of explanation that the causal view proposes. Instead of a cause -- e.g., a mental event like desire or intention -- the qualitative view maintains that the "mental" is not a primitive datum accessible from a first-person perspective, but rather something achieved through action, including intersubjective actions like struggles for recognition. Taylor maintains that the causal theory of action is inherently atomist, while the qualitative theory comprehends and includes actions that are irreducibly collective, in short ours, that cannot be reduced to or analyzed as a collection of actions that are mine.

Finally, Taylor observes that for Hegel there is a crucial level of activity which is not only more than individual, but more than merely human. Some of what we do we can understand more deeply as the action of spirit through us. Thus we have to transcend our ordinary self-understanding. To the extent that our common-sense view of ourselves is atomist, we have to make two transpositions or decenterings: in the first we come to understand that some of our actions are those of communities; in the second we see that some are the work of spirit. The latter includes the individual, his community, and their relation to the divine.

Taylor thus argues not only that Hegel has a view of action, but one that is a critique of the causal view and firmly grounded in and expressive of the qualitative view. For Hegel the qualitative theory of action is basic and all pervasive. This makes Hegel indispensable for those interested in the perennial issue of action, and this fact places Hegel on the agenda of analytically oriented philosophers of action. Moreover, Taylor maintains that the concept of action is a hermeneutical lens and paradigm through which Hegel's system of philosophy may be opened up and its architecture and leading concepts revealed.

The first volume supported Taylor's claim that for Hegel the qualitative theory of action is both basic and all pervasive by including essays on Hegel's Logic that reflected the widely accepted view that the Logic is the basic discipline of Hegel's system and articulates the patterns in the other philosophical sciences, the Philosophy of Nature and the Philosophy of Spirit. And it included essays exploring the concept of action in Hegel's Philosophy of Religion, Hegel's Theory of Political Action and Ethical Life.

The essays in Hegel on Action are both narrower in scope on Hegel, and wider in scope than Hegel. The essays are narrower in scope on Hegel in that they focus on the Phenomenology and Philosophy of Right and on extracting and discussing Hegel's views on freedom, agency, imputability and responsibility (eight essays). There are no essays on Hegel's Logic or Philosophy of Religion. Non-metaphysical readings and a focus on action within the broad framework of anthropology (including abstract right, morality, and ethical life) are in a majority, although there is a vocal minority that challenges these readings.

The essays are also wider in scope than Hegel because the purpose of the editors of this volume is to encourage and promote dialogue between Hegel scholars and those working in the philosophy of action. The volume seeks to summarize the discussions that have occurred since the first volume appeared and point to possible future matters of inquiry. The result is an inevitable fragmentation compared to the lead essay by Taylor. This fragmentation shows that the topic continues to be a work in progress that defies any simple summation. The editors refer to the non-metaphysical readings of Hegel advanced by Hartmann, Pinkard and Pippin, and the Hegel reception in Pittsburgh analytical philosophers John McDowell and Robert Brandom, as important scholarly events relevant to their topic. And they point to Michael Quante's Hegel's Concept of Action, the only book-length study that relates Hegel to figures like Anscombe, Davidson, and Goldman.

Quante's essay in this volume begins with a discussion of the preliminary issues that must be addressed in relating Hegel's thought to the topic of action. According to Quante, the core of Hegel's philosophy of action is to be found in the Phenomenology of Spirit and Philosophy of Right. These works have quite different agendas. The Phenomenology is the introduction to Hegel's system, which, as a self-accomplishing skepticism, demonstrates that all alternatives to the system self-destruct, and that the system itself arises out of this self-destruction as its truth. Thus, given its role as a self-accomplishing skepticism, it is a ladder to the absolute standpoint of the system, relevant to, but not the system itself.

In contrast, the Philosophy of Right presupposes the derivation of the concept of right in the affirmative exposition of the concept of recognition set forth in the Encyclopedia system. Quante concentrates on the Philosophy of Right. However, there is more: any systematic appropriation of Hegel's philosophy of action is confronted with the difficulty that his philosophy is a system whose fundamental discipline is the Logic. Many Anglo-American philosophers, including Charles Taylor and Allen Wood regard Hegel's Logic as dead, at least for their interests and purposes. This thesis is hotly contested by other Hegel scholars. Quante tries to straddle this controversy. He says that in the Logic Hegel works with metaphysical presuppositions that are neither self-evident nor indispensable for the limited needs of a philosophy of action. Quante tries to avoid appeal to or use of the Logic as a justification of his account. However, he notes that in the Philosophy of Right Hegel himself allows that the everyday experience of agency can serve in lieu of logical speculative justification. But Quante also claims that Hegel's reference to ordinary consciousness is intended to include the practices of ascribing and assuming responsibility as well as giving and accepting excuses. He concedes that these practices do not count as a justification in Hegel's sense, but rather help to make plausible Hegel's theory of agency. Quante places that theory in the context of Hegel's discussion of morality. This point is rightly disputed by Pippin and others. As Taylor notes, the concept of action is not confined to the morality discussion, but is more pervasive in Hegel.

Stephen Houlgate criticizes Quante's putative turn to ordinary consciousness and his bracketing of the Logic. He cites Quante's claim that Hegel's concept of action does not itself imply the presence of a moral attitude in the agent; action is morally neutral. This moral neutrality resembles the liberty of indifference and atomistic freedom that is the target of Hegel's critique. Even though he contextualizes Hegel's theory of action in the morality discussion, Quante declares that freedom of choice is sufficient for action. Houlgate objects that, on the contrary, one of Hegel's achievements is to have explained why human action is necessarily subject to moral evaluation.

He observes that while it is true that action as initially described by Hegel in §§113-124 involves no moral attitude and no concept of autonomy on the part of the agent, nevertheless, when the concept of action is unfolded, action is shown to have to be inherently subject to moral demands that entail autonomy. This is the case because all action is an expression of right in the broad sense. Hegel asserts that right is any existence which is the existence of free will, such that every right is the embodiment of freedom and every stage in the development of freedom has its own distinctive right. (§§29-30) This claim in turn presupposes the deduction of right in the concept of recognition furnished by the Encyclopedia Phenomenology.

Francesca Menegoni's essay connects Hegel's concept of recognition with his concept of action. She claims that the core of Hegel's concept of action is the interweaving of the perspective of personal convictions of the individual with the perspective of intersubjective recognition. She qualifies this misleading dual perspective language when she observes that these perspectives are inseparable moments of a whole. (244) Even so, mutual recognition is surely not a perspective on a whole.  It is the whole that is not itself a particular perspective, but that which reflects and includes and communicates between diverse perspectives. The I that has become a We is both itself and a member of the whole, and the whole arises out of the indivisible mutual-reciprocal action of its members.

Menegoni focuses her discussion of action and recognition on Hegel's critique of the moral vision of the world in Chapter 6 of the Phenomenology. There Hegel distinguishes conscience from abstract morality, which is abstract because morality lacks the element of intersubjective recognition. (Phenomenology § 640) Conscience is the dialectical successor to the morality position. Hegel asserts that action is the translation of individual content into the objective element in which it is universal and recognized, and it is just the fact that it is recognized that makes the deed a reality. In conscience, the Sache selbst becomes a subject that makes explicit and is certain of all the moments of consciousness within it. The Sache selbst has substantiality in the ethical sphere, external existence in culture; it is the self-knowing essentiality of thought in morality; in conscience it is the subject that knows these moments within it.

However, while conscience appears to be the promised land where individual conviction and mutual recognition come together, Menegoni points out that for Hegel conscience is ambiguous: on the one hand it can express the presence of the subject in his action and language and be recognized as such by others, and on the other hand conscience can also dissemble that apparent presence -- hypocrisy. In this case its universality and language are not genuine communication, but the opposite, i.e., the arbitrary fabrication of what it alleges to be good and just. (254) In such dissembling conscience becomes evil: it retreats within itself and engages either in hypocrisy or the self-certain silence that refuses communication and reciprocity. It becomes a beautiful soul that does not act and refuses to sully its moral purity and good intentions.

In Menegoni's view the affirmative connotations of conscience -- the moral genius that knows immediately its inner voice as the voice of God -- require genuine action and communication. An example of such genuine action is the mutual confession, the reconciling 'Yea' that is the absolute spirit. This recognition she says is not process in fieri or infinite progress, but rather something real. (256) In the Yea all the possibilities of conscience are held together: 1) self-certainty as a conviction that must be expressed, 2) the struggle for recognition, and 3) the capacity to find oneself in this other. The reconciling Yea conserves, partakes, and realizes both individual conviction and intersubjective recognition. She asserts that this Yea is delivered with a metaphor laden with meaning: the reconciling Yea is defined as the "God that manifests itself" among self-consciousnesses.

However, there is an ambiguity in Menegoni's account. She notes that conscience manifests itself in the language with which the community expresses its own spirit, that is, itself. And she correctly notes that this expression and presence of conscience in its language can occur both in the institutions of ethical life and in religion. However, she claims that the transitions from morality to religion in the Phenomenology of Spirit and from morality to Sittlichkeit in the Philosophy of Right are isomorphic and mirror each other because for both reconciliation between self-consciousnesses comes only through reciprocal recognition, and this in turn only occurs within a community. Since religion is an issue in this recognition involved in the Phenomenology but not in the Philosophy of Right, what is meant by this isomorphism? Does it mean that Menegoni believes that Hegel regards religion, the voice of God, etc. as mere metaphors for community? That absolute spirit is reducible to objective spirit?

Menegoni discusses Hegel's apparent identification of reciprocal recognition with absolute spirit at the conclusion of the Spirit chapter. Menegoni claims that through the figure of conscience Hegel outlines the ontological rather than merely the ethical structure of the agent's subjectivity. It is difficult to know what this means, since on her account the Yea holds all the possibilities -- including the ontological possibilities -- of conscience together. Is God included in the ontological structure of the agent's subjectivity? Is the recognition with which the chapter concludes something like a postulate of morality? If so, how has Hegel's discussion of conscience and action moved beyond Kantian morality? It does not seem to be a postulate, because as Menegoni points out, the recognition that concludes the chapter is not a process in fieri, but instead is something real. But what is the reality here? Is it the community established by the final realization and consummation of reciprocal recognition? Is it God? Is it both, to wit, Absolute Spirit? In the Phenomenology Hegel passes from the accomplishment of mutual recognition in the reconciling Yea to absolute spirit. But it is difficult to see how this would be possible on Menegoni's account, which presents the ontological structure of agency as consisting in personal conviction on the one hand and mutual recognition on the other.

Although Menegoni knows that Hegel's discussion of conscience mediates the transition from morality to religion, (255) she leaves Hegel's philosophy of religion out of account, and declares Hegel's God-language in his exposition of conscience to be metaphorical. It may be more than metaphorical. Consider a text from Hegel's Philosophy of Religion cited by Guy Planty-Bonjour in Hegel's Philosophy of Action: "Der Natur des Geistes selbst ist es, sich zu manifestieren, sich gegenständlich zu machen; dies ist seine Tat, seine Lebendigkeit, seine einzige Tat (und er ist nur seine Tat)." Planty-Bonjour believes that Hegel is a Neo-Aristotelian revising Aristotle's concept of God as energeia and actus purus in favor of action that is historical and social. The reconciling 'Yea' would signify not merely a collective action that cannot be reduced to a collection of self-enclosed minds, but an action in which the evil self-enclosed conscience is transcended and opened to an other in a mediation that, in Taylor's language, is something more than merely human.

The volume includes an essay on Hegel's Theory of Social Agency by Pippin with a critical response by McDowell, not to this specific essay, but to Pippin's general interpretation of Hegel on action. Pippin's essay focuses on the self-other relation. According to Pippin, Hegel's thesis is that the self-relation (presupposed by causal theories) cannot be understood apart from social relations and that my relation to myself is mediated by my relation to others. (60) Pippin proceeds to explain Hegel's thesis in some detail by examining Chapter 5 of the Phenomenology. Hegel engages in a phenomenological critique of the voluntarist position which depends on an abstract but unsustainable strict separation between the inner motive and its external manifestation. Hegel explores how this separation and opposition might be resolved in an exploration of literary and historical types that is unlike anything attempted before in the history of philosophy. (67) He finds the resolution in the concept of action, which does away with the abstraction of an inexpressible inner separated from outer manifestation. In the accomplished deed this spurious infinity is overcome. In the simplicity of the deed the individual is for others a universal being who really is and who ceases to be something only meant. (Phenomenology § 322) With action something has been opened up that is not just for the agent, but for others as well. For Pippin, Hegel summarizes his position in the following text: "Action is only the translation of its individual content into the objective element in which it is universal and recognized, and it is just the fact that it is recognized that makes the deed a reality." (Phenomenology § 640) The fact that the action is objective and universal means that it is for others as well, and this being-for-others implies that the agent does not exercise any kind of proprietary ownership of deed and cannot unilaterally determine the meaning of what was done. (68) The action remains open to contestation.

Pippin's account of how the self-relation is mediated by others raises questions. He combines a non-metaphysical reading of Hegel with a social constructivist account of norms. Actions both disclose what an agent takes herself to be doing and manifest some normative claim to entitlement so that to act is not merely 'up to me', but reflects widely shared social proprieties. Pippin's position is that being a subject or an agent is for Hegel not an ontological question but an achieved social status such as being a citizen or being a professor, a product of mutually recognitive attitudes. This means that different historical communities establish this status in different ways and there is no truth-maker or fact of the matter they are getting wrong or more and more right. (65)

McDowell criticizes Pippin's non-metaphysical reading and constructivist interpretation. (83) In Pippin's reading, McDowell claims, Hegel's departure from Kant is a move from one constructivism to another. Pippin's Hegel replaces the Kantian position in which social norms are legislated by pure practical reason with one in which norms are constructively determined in the recognitive practices of actual historical communities. And he applies this constructivism not just to ethical norms but to normativity in general. Pippin's Hegel embraces a radical anti-realism about norms: there is nothing left to counting as a norm (or agent) other than being taken to be one, circulating within a society.

McDowell criticizes Pippin's thesis that the normative status of agenthood is conferred or constructed in recognition. (83) Rationality and agenthood are not possible apart from recognition and communal practices. But they are not reducible to a communally conferred status like being entitled to vote. Responsiveness to reasons, the very idea of which is inseparable from the idea of communal practices, manifests not merely a biological particular, but a being of a metaphysically new kind like Rousseau's citizen, a conception that is an ancestor of Hegel's thinking. (84) The significance of actions consists in their being practical employments of conceptual capacities and these make sense only in the context of a shared practice. But that is not to say that actions are what they are by being taken to be what they are by other participants in the practice. (89-90)

To be sure, Pippin acknowledges the above point when he observes in commenting on Hegel's Sache selbst (68) that "my intention is doubly real: it is out there in the deed and the deed is essentially out there for others." (68) But Pippin's constructivist interpretation threatens to collapse the double reality of the agent and the deed into the 'for-others'. This becomes clear when he emphasizes Hegel's assertion that "it is just the fact that it is recognized that makes the deed a reality." (69)

Recognition does not literally make the agent or her deed a reality in the constructivist sense. Instead, McDowell maintains that recognition by others mediates by opening one's eyes to what one's intentions were/are, and enabling agents to become freer and more rational, more able to find their way around in the space of reasons. That imagery expresses a realism about reasons, but not a pre-critical rationalism that Pippin (and Hegel) reject. For McDowell, Pippin's Hegel recoils into an equally one-sided attribution of independence to the social practices overlooked by pre-critical rationalism. McDowell believes that Hegel achieves a balance of idealism (constructivism) and realism in which there is dependence and independence on both sides, and that this yields a realism of a different kind. (84-90) Hegel adds that in such a higher realism the distinction between idealism and realism "makes no difference" because in the whole neither unity nor differentiation can be separated from each other.

Space limitations do not permit further discussion of the remaining eight essays in Hegel on Action -- apologies to the authors. The editors acknowledge that there is no single 'right way' of organizing this inchoate yet interrelated and useful material. I have included in my review two of the three essays that they say most inspired their project. They have produced an interesting, rich, and challenging volume.