Hegel on Beauty

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Julia Peters, Hegel on Beauty, Routledge, 2015, 161pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138795952.

Reviewed by Andrew Bowie, Royal Holloway, University of London


The revival of interest in Hegel associated with the move away from grand metaphysical interpretations towards seeing Hegel as the philosopher of the 'sociality of reason' (Terry Pinkard) has had significant effects in areas of contemporary philosophy that had previously paid little attention to Hegel. However, with the exception of some important recent work by Robert Pippin, this revival has not been centrally concerned with Hegel's extensive reflections on art and philosophy. Given the focus of so much mainstream philosophy on epistemology, metaphysics, and ethics, this is not surprising. However, the fact that, having already produced the version of his system that appears in the Encyclopedia in 1817, Hegel himself repeatedly lectured on aesthetics during the 1820s suggests that the issue of art may have left him with unfinished business.

The issues here are further complicated by the fact that the standard edition of Hegel's lectures on aesthetics, prepared by his pupil, H.G. Hotho, may not accurately reflect what Hegel actually said in his lectures. Hotho seems to have been concerned to produce a text that is based on the structures that inform the rest of Hegel's philosophy. Recent editions of transcripts of his lectures made by his students at the time have added a further dimension to any assessment of what Hegel thought about art by calling this systematising element into question. The core issue here is Hegel's idea that art in modernity could no longer play the role it had, for example, played in ancient Athens. Just why this is the case, though, is very much affected by how Hegel characterises art and its relationship to philosophy, and this in turn is affected by the detail of the various editions of his lectures. Even more importantly, these issues pose questions concerning the very status of philosophy in modernity.

The familiar claims by Hegel that have been so influential are that art, because it is 'limited to a distinct content', no longer 'fulfils our highest need' (Hegel 1965 I p. 21). 'Thought and reflection have overtaken [überflügelt] art', and 'The science of art is thus in our time much more necessary than in times in which art for itself as art provided complete satisfaction' (ibid.). In this form the point seems simple: art is tied to the particulars that convey its content, whereas philosophy, because it deals in universals, is better able to grasp the truth, including the particular kind of truth manifest in art. The growing power of the universally applicable theories produced by the modern natural sciences underline what is at issue here in that society's direction is influenced more by technological advances than by cultural production. Hegel famously claims that beauty is the 'sensuous appearing of the Idea' (ibid. p. 117), which entails that the higher form of the idea is non-sensuous and takes the form of philosophy, in the broad sense of that which integrates particular forms of knowledge and norms of action into a system.

Julia Peters' intelligent and interesting book explores the significance of what Hegel says about beauty, both highlighting aspects of the student transcripts and challenging some of the received wisdom on this topic, such as the idea that Hegel is only interested in the beauty of art and not in the beauty of nature. She sums up her aim as follows: 'if we want to understand Hegel's views on the place of art in modernity, we need to elucidate his notion of beauty' (p. 2).

Rather than just focusing on Hegel's Aesthetics, she also adds a vital new dimension to the debate by looking at his remarks on anthropology. The initial idea she considers is of beauty as 'the unity of spirit and nature' (p. 8), which is particularly associated with ancient Greek culture. Importantly -- and this is her key contention -- beauty is not primarily associated with works of art but rather with 'human nature' and is 'embodied by the human individual' as 'a conception of what human individuals, ideally, ought to be like' (p. 11). Indeed 'the paradigmatic instance of a beautiful object for Hegel is not the work of art, but the human individual' (p. 13). Human beings, unlike animals, Hegel's anthropology argues, have to acquire habits that enable them successfully to inhabit their natural body, so that 'second nature results from a transformation and integration of first nature' (p. 28), first nature being the body one contingently is. Rather than the beauty of art being the primary factor, then, 'art can be beautiful by imitating the human figure because the latter exhibits the very feature that is constitutive of beauty: the Einbildung of spirit into natural immediacy' (p. 43). Peters uses this view to reject accounts of Hegel's position that see 'the relevant type of sensuously perceptible spiritual mediation, which is constitutive of beauty for Hegel' as 'exclusive to art' (p. 52). As such 'all that is required for beauty is a unity or identity of spirit and nature, or soul and body' (p. 53). This claim is then used against 'Adorno's deeper criticism that there is no place for nature in Hegel's conception of beauty' (p. 58).

At this point the stakes in the debate over art and philosophy in modernity start to become apparent because what is in question is the very notion of 'nature'. Adorno, though, does not just see 'nature' as the 'other' of spirit. Albrecht Wellmer has suggested that 'The nature which we, as acting and deliberating creatures, are aware of as our own nature -- the nature Adorno speaks of -- is . . . the living nature of our body with its neediness, its impulses, its potentials and its vulnerability' (Wellmer 2009 p. 220), out of which artistic expression develops. Peters arguably does too little to interrogate what is meant by nature, adopting Hegel's approach, in which nature is essentially a form of immediacy, largely on trust. In doing so she misses some of the point of Adorno's questioning of Hegel on the beauty of nature. There is a dialectic in the relationship between the beauty of nature and the beauty of art that undergoes historical changes such that appreciation of each can depend on the development of the other. Verlaine's line that 'la mer est plus belle que les cathédrales' (Adorno 1973 p. 103) suggests that it is only after the mediation of Geist that a certain appreciation of nature becomes possible, but that mediation itself involves nature, as forms in Gothic cathedrals derive in part from trees.

Peters invests a great deal in the idea of 'the human form, a given form of nature' in order to ground the idea of 'an immediate embodiment of spirit' (p. 68) as constitutive of beauty. She cites Hegel on painters: 'if he is a true painter, an artist, he has to flatter', excluding physical characteristics of the subject being painted 'which belong to the sphere of contingency and faulty (bedürftig) life' (p. 70). The immediate objection here can be exemplified by Rembrandt's late self-portraits, which live from the sense of 'contingent and faulty life' manifest in the subject's face and whose 'beauty' presumably lies precisely in their presentation of what Hegel thinks the painter should exclude. Peters is aware of what is at issue here, and the problem is central to her argument, but her argument can at times seem to come down just to redefining the sense of the word 'beauty' in Hegel, which means that questions arising from the tensions in the term are underplayed.

Her claim about the limitations of beauty is that 'where the human individual embodies a perfect unity of spirit and nature, she is lacking a dimension of subjectivity that manifests itself in the capacity to distance oneself and withdraw from one's natural or quasi-natural determinations' (p. 80). The lack Peters describes echoes what Hegel says about 'Classical' and 'Romantic' art. The nature of the latter is manifest in the Christian story of Christ's embodiment, death, and resurrection, where there is a dynamic of contradiction and resolution rather than the simple unity of Classical art. Classical art's combination of the spiritual and the natural is the 'completion of the realm of beauty. There cannot be anything, and nothing can become, more beautiful' (Hegel 1965 I p. 498). Consequently, in Romantic art, 'beauty in its most appropriate form and its most apt content is no longer the ultimate aim' (ibid. p. 499) because the unity of spirit and nature is dissolved. This situation leads Hegel to reflections on how the objects from which art can be made become more and more arbitrary, which prefigure important developments in modernism: think of Baudelaire's 'Une charogne', which uses a rotting horse carcass as a metaphor for the poet's lover.

Peters seeks to add an ethical dimension to what is implied by the limitations of 'beauty' as the unity of spirit and nature, illustrating this with a sensitive Hegelian reading of Sophocles' Antigone, where 'Creon stands for the community, Antigone for the family' (p. 89). The latter therefore lacks an ethical dimension because the family tie is more 'immediate' than the 'mediated' ties to the state that enable the peaceful existence of a broader community. Whether Peters' point can adequately be made via this text is, though, open to question: in democratic Athens, the king in such a tragedy cannot simply be seen as positively representing the community. Her adherence to Hegel's notion of beauty, where 'pain [she is referring in particular to Antigone's inner conflict over her relationship to the community] marks a limit of beauty in Hegel's view' and 'beauty consists in a state of undisturbed unity of spirit and nature' (p. 116), can start to obscure rather than illuminate key aspects of art's relationship to modernity. It can be valid to use a term like beauty in a specified way derived from a philosopher as central to our self-understanding as Hegel. Indeed, Peters adverts to the problem of 'external criticism', which would involve saying that beauty is simply not what Hegel makes it out to be. However, if beauty is essential to understanding 'Hegel's views on the place of art in modernity' and if we want to arrive at a critical assessment of those views in order to explore the relationship of art to philosophy, the point comes where this use of a foundational concept should itself be subjected to scrutiny.

Even more fundamentally, Hegel's verdict that the 'science of art', i.e. philosophy, is more important than art in modernity should not pass without scrutiny either. It is hardly as if philosophy today plays a major determining role in public life: that role is taken by science and technology. The claim would therefore have to be that philosophy can fully articulate the real content of art, thus, as Peters suggests, making art potentially 'redundant' (p. 142). Most of Peters' examples are of Classical literary texts or from the visual arts, where the idea of a unity of spirit and nature, of the kind seen in some characters in drama or Greek sculptures, may seem appropriate. But the example of Rembrandt should again give pause for thought: can the pain apparent in the appearance of age, where the physical decline can be seen as in disharmony with the spiritual aspect of the subject depicted, be usefully said to 'mark a limit of beauty'? We may forego using the word 'beauty' in the Hegelian sense for such paintings, but what word do we wish to use to express what is essential to them, and what is at stake here? Beethoven's late music, particularly the quartets and the Missa Solemnis, also dissolve any overall harmony of form and content. It is significant that Peters hardly mentions music, which becomes the key to art in modernity for many thinkers from around the end of the eighteenth century, which is also the time when the aesthetic appreciation of wild nature comes to the fore,. Late Beethoven is hard to characterise without some sense in which the music transcends the divisions that it so evidently also depends on, and it is the combination of division, pain, and transcendence that seems so important here.

Peters does argue that 'romantic art begins to concern itself with the pain and inner division that are necessarily absent from the perfect unity of soul and body that is constitutive of the aesthetic human ideal' (p. 133). The problem is that this ideal can come to seem ideological, a kind of desire to inhabit the Lacanian 'imaginary'. The coopting of a certain kind of human beauty for advertising purposes, for example, evidently does social damage, blocking the sense of the different ways in which people can be valued. It is not that one should try to conjure away the notion of human beauty, but it needs to be seen as involving tensions and contradictions and so as not necessarily an ideal involving 'perfect unity'. It is no coincidence that post-Hegelian views of Greek art ask about what underlies its beauty of form. Nietzsche suggests that the notional unity is grounded on something that is anything but harmonious: without pain and division the motivation for the presentation of the unity of soul and body would in this sense be essentially lacking. Similarly, the great music of modernity is predicated on pain and division, and music comes to play a central role in modern culture that a Hegelian account of it as 'sounding inwardness' fails to capture: is what we get from Beethoven and Wagner really just external sonic expression of inner feelings? Indeed, beauty in music, though it can also become ideological, seems less likely to generate the kind of tensions apparent in human beauty because the greatest music depends precisely on acknowledgement of negativity as its ground.

In seeking to characterise an alternative modern view of beauty as 'Schein', Peters cites Hegel's example of the prosaic scenes of everyday life in Dutch paintings as seeking 'not to draw their spectator's attention to what they represent, but to the act of representing itself', so conveying 'a kind of immanent meaningfulness' (p. 136). The example is an important one, but the conclusion Peters draws from it can be questioned. The first of her remarks puts the emphasis on the subject that does the representing, suggesting that the object of representation is merely arbitrary, in the manner indicated above, as the consequence of the development of Romantic art. However the second part of the remark suggests a different approach: it seems unsatisfactory to say of such painting that it 'does not point beyond itself' (p. 136). Heidegger's point (using the admittedly mistaken example of the Van Gogh painting of a pair of 'peasant' shoes that in fact belonged to the painter) that a painting of an apparently arbitrary domestic object can disclose the world to which that object belongs surely applies to great Dutch painting. In this conception, immanent meaningfulness is always a possibility, but one which requires art to make it manifest, drawing our attention to what would otherwise be hidden in the 'prose of everyday life'.

Peters does not consider the model of art as world-disclosive because her focus is on the historical fate of the notion of beauty as unity of soul and body. In this context the lack of agreement on what is beautiful -- some people will just not get the 'beauty' of another person or a work of art -- also suggests why Kant's view of beauty is anything but wholly superseded. The Kantian notion that we should distinguish between what one merely happens to like and what one thinks should be argued for as culturally valuable for a society points to a way beyond mere aesthetic relativism that does not require a notion of beauty as harmony of subjective and objective. Kant himself may predicate his version of beauty just on the notion of pleasure, but in modernity argument about the appreciation of what art conveys beyond just pleasure is vital to the kind of culture we might hope to inhabit.

Part of what art conveys can be seen precisely in terms of what may elude the dominant forms of philosophy, and this is a possibility that does not fit well in a Hegelian framework. Interestingly, one of the best contemporary Hegelians, Robert Pippin, has formulated what is at issue here most effectively, suggesting serious questions for contemporary normative readings of Hegel and again hinting at the central importance of music in these debates. Pippin is concerned precisely with modernism's revolt against beauty in art (his main example is the paintings of Manet) and with the limits of Hegelianism with respect to understanding why art in modernity cannot give way to the 'science of art':

Art, precisely because it is a mode of non-discursive intelligibility, which does not consist in propositions, arguments, and syllogisms, nonetheless makes sense of ourselves in a way that actually resonates with what is now coming onto the scene as more important than the conscious deliberative capacities of individual subjects (Pippin 2011).

Pippin talks of the sense of 'wrongness' that accompanies the advances of modern rationality, which leads to art as a form of protest at the direction of the modern world. In contrast, Peters summarises the Hegelian position as follows: 'Hegel could not, and did not, wholeheartedly recommend that art emancipate itself from beauty altogether in modernity . . . At the same time, no clear account of how art can continue to be beautiful in modernity emerges from Hegel's writings' (p. 143). Her conclusion from this is that 'we know at least that there is no way back' (p. 143) to classical forms of beauty. Her book succeeds in suggesting some novel ways of construing how the centrality of beauty in Hegel should be understood but does not always take sufficient account of how alternative conceptions of art's relationship to philosophy might change the nature of the debate over beauty. How these conceptions affect the Hegel who is now seen as the philosopher of the 'game of giving reasons' and of the 'sociality of reason' has only just begun to be explored. The lines between mediation and immediacy are particularly complex when aesthetic questions become part of the debate because the sense made by 'non-discursive intelligibility' depends precisely on the fact that it is not reducible to the game of giving reasons (see Bowie 2007, 2013).


Adorno, T.W. (1973) Ästhetische Theorie, (Frankfurt: Suhrkamp)

Bowie, A. (2007) Music, Philosophy, and Modernity, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press)

Bowie, A. (2013) Adorno and the Ends of Philosophy, (Cambridge: Polity)

Hegel, G.W.F. (1965) Ästhetik Vols. 1 and 2, ed. Bassenge, (Berlin, Weimar: Aufbau)

Pippin, R. (2011) 'After Hegel: an Interview with Robert Pippin'

Wellmer, A. (2009) 'Bald frei, bald unfrei' -- Reflexionen über die Natur im Geist (MS). (English: 'On Spirit as a Part of Nature' Constellations, Vol. 16 No. 2, pp. 213-26)